Faith and Humility

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Jonathan L. Kvanvig, Faith and Humility, Oxford University Press, 2018, 219pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198809487.

Reviewed by Daniel Speak, Loyola Marymount University


Jonathan Kvanvig's most recent monograph makes an important set of contributions to an increasingly lively family of philosophical discussions of the nature, limits, and import of both of its titular concepts. Beyond the illuminating treatments of faith and humility individually, Kvanvig also advances an interesting claim about their relationship to one another as something like virtue partners, balancing each other out by way of their distinctive characters. There is a great deal to learn from this book, about intellectual and moral virtue, about the role of faith and humility in a well-lived life, about the shortcomings of much Christian theology and practice with respect to these traits, and especially -- and somewhat surprisingly -- about philosophical methodology. It is clear throughout the book that Kvanvig is attracted to the thesis that the most admirable forms of human life will require both faith and humility, though he admits to coming up short in providing a robust philosophical defense of this controversial view. Still, it does help to see this attraction as animating much of the argumentation he musters, since a fundamental meta-philosophical feature of his approach is the foregrounding of axiology in the pursuit of understanding the target traits. One way to feel the axiological basis of his approach is to have his end in mind. He tells us by way of conclusion that "a life of both faith and humility is a thing of beauty, grace, and goodness, at least when not distorted by failures along other dimensions of virtue and behavior" (203). And also that "Models of such lives are found among the great heroes of every major world religion and also among our greatest voices for moral progress and social justice" (203). Indeed, Kvanvig is explicit, even if a tad sheepish, about the fact that he has written this book "in hope for more such lives" (203). I certainly join him in this hope, as I am sure will many of his readers. I am confident this hope will be strengthened by the support Kvanvig's book provides for it, even for those, like me, who are tempted to resist his arguments at various points.

The book is roughly evenly divided between discussion of faith (chapters 1-5) and discussion of humility (chapters 7-9), with crucial consideration of the relationship between them developed in chapter 6. It concludes with a very brief chapter (10) highlighting some of the advantages of taking the approach that Kvanvig has been recommending. Rather than discussing each chapter explicitly, I will make some effort to lay out the central lines of argument, with an eye to those aspects that I take to be controversial or otherwise worthy of special attention.

Kvanvig begins by articulating an approach to the topic of faith (one, presumably, that generalizes to the treatment of humility and other potentially significant human characteristics) that "puts axiology first" (2). As he insightfully recognizes, analytic philosophers too frequently suppose that the route to an account of some concept, like "faith," is by way of establishing the necessary and sufficient conditions of the proper employment of the relevant term across natural language contexts. We can discern two kinds of concern with this approach from Kvanvig's perspective. First, and this is a point that recurs throughout the monograph, conditions can be necessary and sufficient without being explanatorily or constitutively fundamental. So, identifying necessary and sufficient conditions for faith might leave us without any deep answers to questions regarding the nature or import of faith. Second, natural language may deploy the terminology of "faith" in ways that turn out to be largely insignificant to us. We simply may not care about or value faith in a wide range of common contexts, even though our use of the terminology in these contexts is completely felicitous. For this reason, Kvanvig constrains his inquiry by seeking to attend only to "faith worth having," by which he means a form of faith that contributes significantly to living a good human life. Here a very quick (and to my mind questionable) inference emerges. Kvanvig moves from the claim that the brand of faith in which he is interested will have to be properly connected to human well-being, to the claim, therefore, that the brand of faith will have to be a virtue. Whether questionable or not, however (and more on this below), the virtue inference leads Kvanvig to conclude that faith must have an essentially dispositional structure, with behavioral, affective, and cognitive elements.

This leads naturally to the question of just how cognitive we should expect the valuable form of faith to be. That is, we can rightly wonder how belief-like faith should be understood to be, with the most stringently cognitive accounts of faith insisting that it is a species of belief, or at least that it entails belief in some proposition very closely connected to the target of the faith. Kvanvig argues against this kind of cognitivism about faith, putting the emphasis instead on a disposition to act, in particular, a disposition to act in the service of an ideal. While this disposition may, on occasion, and maybe even somewhat generally, generate some beliefs or other cognitive commitments, these are not fundamental to the nature of the state. This conclusion is driven both by the account of the purpose of faith Kvanvig enunciates (in terms of setting an agent's ends and unifying her over time) and by its contrast with what he argues is the real impulse in Christian accounts of faith.

Though Kvanvig casts his lot with the non-cognitivists, there are competing non-cognitivist accounts with which he compares and contrasts his preferred view. Here we get perhaps the most interesting forms of philosophical clash in the book, since a number of the most recent developments in the philosophical literature on faith have emerged as either non-cognitivist or as only marginally cognitivist. Though Kvanvig recognizes the wisdom of certain aspects of the contemporary emphasis on trust, he nevertheless rejects trust-based accounts of faith, arguing that trust is neither necessary nor sufficient for faith. At the same time, he also seeks to distinguish his view from the recent influential view of faith developed by Lara Buchak. I predict that Kvanvig's treatment of Buchak's view will be the subject of considerable further scrutiny. In particular, I suspect that his treatment of Buchak's view as based on "preference" will generate substantial response, since Buchak herself has emphasized that her view is principally about a disposition to act.

It is clear that one sub-aim of Kvanvig's book is to bring John Dewey's A Common Faith into wider view for the contemporary discussion of faith. In addition to treating Dewey's view substantially (and extremely charitably) in a lengthy chapter of its own (chapter 4), it is not hard to see the structural influence of this view throughout the monograph, animating Kvanvig's dissatisfaction with various competitor views and undergirding his central positive thesis about faith and integrative ideals. In a rather surprising way, I think we can also see Dewey's skepticism about traditional religious faith as Kvanvig's motivation for striking what I take to be the right balance between dismissing and embracing these traditional religious impulses. Kvanvig rightly and sharply criticizes overly doctrinal conceptions of religious faith, as well as the many dangerous downstream effects of this form of theorizing that frequently lead to morally bankrupt dogmatism and authoritarianism. At the same time, he is quick to defend those aspects of religious traditions, and especially of the Christian tradition, that have located their integrative ideals in the model lives of religious exemplars like Moses or Jesus. In fact, Kvanvig argues that his "functional" or "affective" faith fits in better with the traditional Christian tradition than does the received view, according to which faith is principally cognitive and doctrinal. As a consequence, Kvanvig argues that the standard problem of "faith and reason" is the result of a wrong-headed approach to the nature of faith; with the right view of faith in place, the historic concerns about some conflict with reason mostly evaporate.

Turning to humility, Kvanvig is at pains to show at least two things: first, that humility is a virtue and, second, that humility and faith are balancing virtues that hang together. These two points are related, since his expression of the doubts about humility's ability to contribute in the right way to a good human life are partially addressed by its being constrained by the presence of faith. What is it about humility that might provoke doubt about its being a virtue? Well, it can at least appear that people are better off without it, since a certain kind of self-confidence seems to be good for successful living. Played in a slightly different key, humility, in some of its iterations, can appear to be in conflict with a desirable form of autonomy, since the humble person is disposed to allow others to direct her life in a heteronomous way. One important point that Kvanvig makes here is that the mere fact that a certain character trait has the potential to produce bad results for human life does not mean that the trait cannot be a virtue. After all, almost every virtuous trait can, when out of shape or proportion, lead to various forms of ruin. It was in part the recognition of this fact that led the classical tradition to be attracted to the unity of the virtues. But endorsing the unity thesis is surely a bridge too far. Instead, Kvanvig suggests that the point to take away from the dialectic here is that many virtues have partners that function as a counterpoise to the dangerous overworking of their natural impulses. In the case of our need for self-confidence, we can see how faith can serve to counterbalance humility. Since faith, on Kvanvig's view, is a disposition to act in the service of an ideal, it can push the humble agent along toward wise action in the absence of the forms of overconfidence that would be incompatible with humility. Thus, Moses does not have to get himself to believe (in tension with humility) that he is the best man for God's job, provided he is motivated properly to pursue the end of freedom for his people from Pharaoh's slavery. At the same time, an unchecked faith can lead agents to pursue ideal courses of action that have them running roughshod over the innocent and over competing moral principles that they have not properly considered. Here, humility functions to focus attention on what is truly important, which will involve putting a brake on the virtuous agent before his faith runs him into moral trouble.

To develop this core view about the relationship between faith and humility, Kvanvig also weighs in on the contemporary discussion of the nature of humility, especially in its epistemic instantiation. In doing so he considers the importance of the preface paradox for intellectual humility, distinguishes humility from modesty (rejecting the continuum thesis according to which these traits are on the same continuum but at different points along it), takes up its relationship to both vanity and pride, and directly addresses the apparent conflict with autonomy. The heart of his positive view, however, involves attention. The intellectually humble person is not required to have false beliefs about herself, believing that she is less capable than she actually is, for example. Rather, the humble person simply does not attend to the propositions about her capacities, even though there may be some sense in which she could be said to believe those that happen to be true about her. One desirable consequence of this attention view of humility, for Kvanvig, is that it vindicates the view, central to Christian thought, that Jesus expressed humility in the incarnation. Also, and more importantly for his overarching purposes, Kvanvig claims that this account of humility allows it to be just the right kind of virtue partner with faith, since humility understood in these terms keeps the humble person focused on that to which attention is proper under the circumstances, whatever the immediate attractions of the faith-directed ideal.

I have hinted at two bones of contention that I will now say just a bit more about. First, I have taken notice of Kvanvig's impulse to pursue faith understood as a virtue by way of his "worth wanting" methodology. One assumption that appears to underwrite this way of proceeding is something in the neighborhood of the idea that the only traits worth wanting, even worth wanting for the purposes of living well, would have to constitute virtues. This does not seem obviously true. Intelligence, for example, would seem to be a trait worth wanting, but it may not be the kind of thing that could be a virtue in the robust sense (that is, unless we mean to use virtue to pick out any human skill that admits of degrees of excellence, so that three-point shooting and closet-organizing become virtues). I do not mean to argue that there is no virtue of faith (I think there is) or that Kvanvig's strategy of seeking an account of faith worth wanting is wrong-headed (I think it need not be). My point is just that the quick slide from seeking an account of faith worth wanting to seeking an account of faith as a virtue is not necessarily licit. Now, does this illicit move, if it is in fact illicit, have any impact on the overall approach Kvanvig undertakes or on the final conclusions he reaches? I am honestly not sure. But I at least suspect that it has disposed Kvanvig to see the principle focus of evaluation in terms that put him in initial and unnecessary tension with many of his co-theorists about faith. I also suspect that it has made it somewhat too easy for him to dismiss as not worth wanting (and thus not worth our theorizing) those forms of faith that are expressed by sitting in a chair. About these kinds of cases, Kvanvig says, "Even if the language of faith supports the idea that you display faith in a chair by taking a seat, such faith won't be the right kind of faith to consider when attempting to locate the virtue of faith" (16). I am tempted by the view that the chair-sitting faith is very much worth wanting and is on a continuum with the kind of faith that Kvanvig has in mind in his fuller theorizing. As a consequence, I remain concerned that his methodology here blocks important input into our theory construction about faith.

This connects well enough to my other bone of contention, regarding Kvanvig's treatment of Buchak's account of faith. One attractive feature of her account, by my lights, is that it explains how my chair-sitting can be an act of faith and also how this faith can be rational. But set that aside. Kvanvig insists on treating Buckak's view as one grounded in preferences and casts his substantive concerns about her view in light of his worries about how such preferences could deliver the faith goods. As I read Buchak, however, her use of the terminology of preference is not substantive. That is, it is only a standard decision-theoretic way of framing a (minimally rational) disposition to act. Kvanvig certainly recognizes this possibility. As he notes, the problems of Buchak's view that he identifies "would dissipate if the language of preferences were a mere placeholder for something more generic such as a disposition toward certain kinds of action" (42). What Kvanvig says in response to this possibility is that, understood in this way, Buchak's view would not be a relevant alternative to his own. My view is that Kvanvig would do better to treat Buchak's position as, like his own, primarily non-cognitive and dispositional.

As I see things, then, there remain important and illuminating points of difference between Kvanvig's view and Buchak's view the working out of which will further increase of our understanding of faith. For example, we can take note of the fact that Kvanvig's view does not have risk as an essential feature of faith. Since faith (worth having) is a disposition to act in the service of an ideal, it certainly appears that an act of faith can be performed without anything like any doubt about the ideal or about whether the action will succeed. He concedes that the person of faith will often have to take risks, of course, but the risks appear to be inessential to the faith, a contingent feature of some faith-driven actions. Thus the perfectly confident agent can have faith. This continues to strike me as wrong. And since Buchak's account captures the essentially risky nature of faith, her view looks to me to have important advantages over Kvanvig's. I think it is an open question, though, whether faith understood in Buchak's terms can be made to do the work that Kvanvig wants faith to do as a counterpoise to humility. My hope, however, is that future engagement on these points will help us to understand better the relationship between faith, risk, and humility.

With these small points of concern expressed, let me conclude by emphasizing again how much there is to learn from Kvanvig's book. It is rich with epistemology, philosophy of language, virtue theory, and even hermeneutics. Frankly, I contend that the book pays for itself in the intelligent and consistent pressure that Kvanvig applies to traditional dogmatic religious views of faith and humility. The fact that it advances our understanding in many additional and subtle ways is icing on the cake.