Fallibilism: Evidence and Knowledge

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Jessica Brown, Fallibilism: Evidence and Knowledge, Oxford University Press, 2018, 197pp., $54.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198801771.

Reviewed by Aidan McGlynn, The University of Edinburgh


In 1988, Stewart Cohen could write that 'The acceptance of fallibilism in epistemology is virtually universal' (1988: 91). Thirty years on, and things look decidedly different. Part of the reason for the shift is David Lewis's 'Elusive Knowledge' (1996), which suggested that epistemologists can avoid a choice between fallibilism and scepticism, though at the cost of accepting contextualism about knowledge attributions. More recently still, some epistemologists have suggested that by adopting a more generous conception of the evidence we have bearing on the external world than Lewis allowed, infallibilism can avoid both scepticism and contextualism. Perhaps, for example, my evidence right now includes the proposition that there's a laptop in front of me, or that I see that there's a laptop in front of me. Assuming evidence must be true, this is evidence I can have only if there really is a laptop in front of me. My less fortunate envatted twin being fed the appearance of a laptop can't share this evidence with me; in this sense, these more generous conceptions of our evidence endorse a view I'll call evidential externalism, according to which one's evidence does not supervene on one's internal states.[1] Jessica Brown's book targets infallibilism of this latter externalist sort, arguing that the commitments it has to take on in order to avoid scepticism leave it open to a number of serious objections. Moreover, she argues that the main objections to fallibilism are actually issues one comes up against whichever side of the debate one is on, and infallibilism offers no distinctive resources or remedies. Insofar as one is motivated to be a non-sceptical infallibilist, one should follow Lewis's lead and adopt contextualism (or some other kind of 'shifty' epistemology) -- and the motivations for an 'infallibilist renaissance' (4) of any sort are weaker than the recent literature suggests.

The book has seven chapters. Chapter 1 introduces the debate between fallibilism and infallibilism, presenting the main objections to fallibilism which have driven the 'renaissance', and defending a particular characterisation of infallibilism (namely that knowledge requires evidence that entails the truth of what is known). Brown also introduces the two strategies mentioned above for defending a non-sceptical infallibilism -- contextualism (or more generally, shiftiness) and evidential externalism -- and explains why the rest of the book focuses on the latter rather than the former. Chapter 2 argues that any infallibilist epistemology which avoids both scepticism and contextualism will have two problematic commitments; it will be committed to a specific form of evidential externalism, namely 'a factive conception of evidence on which knowing a proposition is sufficient for it to be part of one's evidence', and it will be committed to a particular thesis about evidential support, namely that 'if one knows that p, then p is part of one's evidence for p' (26). The following two chapters are devoted to showing that these commitments are indeed problematic.

Chapter 3 argues against the claim concerning evidential support, contending that a proposition p is never part of one's evidence for p on the grounds that this is the only viable explanation of the observation that a proposition cannot be felicitously cited as evidence for itself. In turn, chapter 4 critically examines the externalist conception of when a proposition is part of one's evidence, on which knowing that p is sufficient for p to be part of one's evidence and evidence is factive. Suppose that I know that there is a laptop in front of me. This suffices for this proposition to be part of my evidence. Since evidence is factive, none of my internal twins who falsely but reasonably believe that there is a laptop in front of them have the same evidence as I do; at best, they have the proposition that it appears to them as if there's a laptop in front of them.[2] Now suppose I infer that there is a computer in the room. My evidence entails the truth of this belief; my twins aren't so fortunate. And so the infallibilist will hold that I'm more justified in believing that there's a computer in the room than my twins are (68-9). This conflicts with the intuition that my unfortunate internal twins and I are equally justified (often called the new evil demon intuition). The main task of the chapter is to argue against a popular strategy for disarming the force of such intuitions, by insisting that my twins and I are not equally justified, but only equally blameless or excusable in believing as we do.

Chapters 5 and 6 shift the focus of Brown's discussion to the topic of defeaters. Chapter 5 offers a simple but to my mind effective argument that everyone should accept examples of what Brown calls revisionary rebutting defeaters: 'revisionary' because they defeat pre-existing justification, and 'rebutting' because they do so through the furnishing of evidence for disbelieving the proposition in question. Chapter 6 defends the contrasting category of undermining defeaters, which instead involve evidence that call into question one's original grounds for believing the proposition, without necessarily calling into question that proposition's truth. Brown concentrates in particular on challenges from epistemologists who suggest that higher-order evidence[3] that my original evidence fails to support proposition p doesn't defeat my justification to belief p, but rather rationalises a level-splitting cocktail of attitudes: p, and my evidence does not support p. Finally, chapter 7 examines objections to fallibilism that turn on claims about the relationship between knowledge and chance. Here Brown looks at the worry that fallibilism is committed to the truth of concessive knowledge attributions of the form 'he knows p, but it might be the case that not-p'), and that it leads to clashes with the knowledge norm of practical reasoning, according to which one ought to rely on p in one's practical reasoning only if one knows p. Brown's main line of response is that these problems arise just as sharply for the infallibilist, though she does also try to show that each can be disarmed.

Epistemologists will get a great deal out of engaging with this book. It's clearly written, and it offers a number of interesting and persuasive arguments on a range of topics at the centre of contemporary epistemology, in particular the relations between knowledge, justification, evidence, and action, scepticism and the epistemology of defeat. Anyone interested in these issues -- so anyone interested in the core concerns of contemporary analytic epistemology -- will find engaging with Brown's timely and welcome contribution rewarding. However, I wasn't always convinced that Brown's discussions of these issues were best framed as contributions to an overarching evaluation of fallibilism and infallibilism. The first half of the book seemed very focused on views I associate with Timothy Williamson and some other proponents of knowledge-first epistemology, such Jonathan Sutton and Clayton Littlejohn: for instance, that evidence is factive, that all knowledge is evidence, evidential externalism, a probabilistic conception of when a proposition is evidence for something, knowledge norms of belief, assertion, and practical reasoning, and the thesis that (fully) justified belief requires knowledge. The reason for this focus is largely due to Brown's deliberate concentration on non-shifty non-sceptical versions of infallibilism, which yields a very particular perspective on the debate; Williamson looms very large, while Peter Unger's well-known scepticism isn't so much as mentioned, and Lewis's contextualism is only treated in passing. I was largely sympathetic to Brown's criticisms of Williamson and Williamson-inspired positions, but I found myself less convinced by the arguments in chapter 2 that any non-shifty infallibilism that avoids scepticism must take this kind of Williamsonian shape. Brown suggests that some readers might skip this chapter, on the grounds that it's clear that some infallibilists accept the claims that she goes on to criticise and so we shouldn't be surprised if they all do (26), but this downplays the significance of the crucial question taken up in this chapter, namely whether Brown's criticisms of Williamson and other knowledge-firsters are really revealing general costs of non-sceptical infallibilism.

I had a similar reaction to chapters 5 and 6; I was on board with almost everything Brown says in defending the various kinds of defeat from challenges, but it wasn't clear why this was of such significance for fallibilism. Brown's own explanation of this significance frames this discussion as a response to a particular kind of objection to fallibilism, namely that fallibilism is committed to failures of multi-premise closure, the principle that if one knows a number of premises and competently deduces a conclusion from them while retaining one's knowledge of one's premises throughout, then one knows one's conclusion (101). According to the objection this principle fails, given a fallibilist conception of knowledge, since fallibilism holds that knowledge is compatible with some degree of epistemic risk, but the conclusion of a piece of deductive reasoning may be too risky to be known even though the individual premises were tolerably risky. However, Brown responds, everyone should accept failures of multi-premise closure, since these are generated, independently of any distinctively fallibilist commitments, by defeaters. The defence of different kinds of defeat across chapters 5 and 6 is Brown's attempt to silence this counter to her counter to the original closure-based concern about fallibilism.

As this might suggest, taken as contributions to the debate on fallibilism, these chapters felt somewhat removed from the centre of the action (though, as I've already noted, they are plenty interesting in their own right). Moreover, the motivations for this foray into the epistemology of defeat seemed questionable, since there are alternative ways that a fallibilist might respond to the closure-failure objection that Brown doesn't give much airtime. One might argue that fallibilism isn't incompatible with multi-premise closure. For example, Martin Smith has offered a version of fallibilism that distances itself from the idea that the kind of justification required for knowledge is a matter of one's evidence making something sufficiently likely to be true, which is what really seems to be driving the original argument that closure fails (see Smith 2010 and 2016, though see also McGlynn 2012: 372-3). Alternatively, one might argue that the failure of multi-premise closure isn't all that objectionable, without conceding that there's any need to show that the principle fails for independent reasons that the infallibilist will be forced to accept too. After all, this closure principle is an ingredient in a number of paradoxes in this vicinity, including the preface and the lottery, and the above reasoning that closure fails has been offered as a relatively popular diagnosis of where the paradoxical reasoning goes wrong (though this response is neither uncontroversial or unproblematic, of course).[4]

Related to this, I didn't find Brown's argument that defeat gives rise to failures of closure entirely compelling, for reasons that are different than those that she concentrates on in chapters 5 and 6. Brown's example involves a detective who competently deduces that Polly committed a theft from a variety of premises that entail this conclusion, and which she knows (103). Given multi-premise closure, it follows that she knows this conclusion. However, the detective then receives a defeater for the conclusion; for example, a trusted colleague tells her that she is likely to have misevaluated the evidence and drawn the wrong conclusion, or that an informant has testified that Peggy rather than Polly was the thief. For the example to falsify multi-premise closure, it needs to be the case that this testimony defeats the detective's knowledge that Polly was the thief, while leaving intact all of the knowledge needed for the relevant instance of the antecedent of the principle to remain true. I suspect I won't be the only epistemologist who worries that this combination isn't possible.[5] Given all this, the discussion of defeat struck me as interesting and persuasive, but rather orthogonal to the debate about fallibilism and infallibilism.


Thanks to Jessica Brown, Angie O’Sullivan, and Martin Smith.


Cohen, Stewart. 1988. 'How to be a Fallibilist.' Philosophical Perspectives 2: 91-123.

DeRose, Keith. 1999. 'Introduction.' In Keith DeRose and Ted Warfield (eds.), Skepticism: A Contemporary Reader. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Fratantonio, Giada and Aidan McGlynn. 2018. 'Reassessing the Case Against Evidential Externalism.' In Veli Mitova (ed.), The Factive Turn in Epistemology. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Lasonen-Aarnio, Maria. 2008. 'Single Premise Deduction and Risk.' Philosophical Studies 141: 157-73.

Lewis, David. 1996. 'Elusive Knowledge.' Australasian Journal of Philosophy 74: 549-67.

McGlynn, Aidan. 2012. 'Justification as Would-Be Knowledge.' Episteme 9: 359-74.

Silins, Nicholas. 2005. 'Deception and Evidence.' Philosophical Perspectives 19: 375-404.

Smith, Martin. 2010. 'What Else Justification Could Be.' Noûs 44: 10-31.

Smith, Martin. 2016. Between Probability and Certainty: What Justifies Belief. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

[1] I borrow this label from Silins 2005: see Fratantonio and McGlynn 2018 for a more recent discussion of this kind of externalism.

[2] I'm skating over issues about the apparently de se content of the evidence in this example.

[3] Higher-order evidence is evidence about one's evidence.

[4] In particular there's a complication here which lurks in the background of Brown's discussion; as DeRose 1999 and Lasonen-Aarnio 2008 show, there is an analogue of the objection Brown discusses that puts pressure on fallibilists to give up single-premise closure, too, and this seems like much more of a cost than abandoning multi-premise closure.

[5] Brown does pre-empt this response (104), but I lack space to discuss her argument.