Familiar Objects and Their Shadows

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Crawford L. Elder, Familiar Objects and Their Shadows, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 210pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107003231.

Reviewed by Daniel Z. Korman, The University of Illinois at Urbana-Champaign


Revisionary views about material objects are all the rage. Many, if not most, metaphysicians accept one or another permissive view about which objects there are, according to which -- in addition to familiar objects like stones and baseballs -- there are countless other medium-sized dry goods, right before our eyes. (More on these "extraordinary" objects below.) Others accept one or another eliminative view, according to which there are no stones, baseballs, or other such familiar objects.

In Familiar Objects and Their Shadows, Crawford Elder advances objections to a wide range of revisionary views, weighing in on a number of issues that are of central importance in the metaphysics of material objects along the way. Elder raises new and interesting points in a debate that some regard as being at a stalemate, and it is refreshing to see a defense of our ordinary conception of objects that is uncompromisingly realist, without a hint of deflationism or anti-realism.

In what follows, I am going to focus on just a few aspects of Elder's critique of revisionary views. But it is worth emphasizing that there is much in Elder's book that I don't discuss here but that may be of interest to readers, including his argument against conventionalism about familiar kinds and familiar objects (chapter 2), his positive realist account of persistence (chapter 3), his argument against stage theory (chapter 4), his response to the causal exclusion arguments in the philosophy of mind (chapter 5), and his positive argument against universalism (§7.3).


I'll begin with Elder's criticism of "explosivism" (a.k.a. diachronic universalism). Roughly put, explosivism is the thesis that there is an object corresponding to every filled region of spacetime. Among other things, explosivists take there to be such objects as incars, where an incar is an object that exists at all and only those times at which an associated car is inside a garage, and which is exactly co-located with the portion of the car that is inside the garage at each of those times. When the car backs halfway out of the garage, the incar shrinks to half its size. When the car leaves the garage, the incar ceases to exist.

Elder's objection to explosivism (§1.4) turns on an unusual theory about the content of judgments about persistence, according to which they have both indicative and imperative content (§1.3). The idea is that part of the content of the judgment that an incar ceased to exist when the car left the garage is a "directive" to expect incars to display certain characteristic "causally governed patterns of continuity and alteration" (23). Elder contends that, because they have this imperative content, judgments about persistence are true only if the associated imperatives are "directives that it would pay us to heed" (23). Consequently, since it would not be useful for us to attend to the patterns of continuity and alteration characteristic of incars, the judgment that an incar ceased to exist when the car left the garage is false.

One can imagine explosivists responding in a variety of ways. They might just deny that judgments of persistence have imperative content. (Elder doesn't exactly argue that they do, though he does allude to work by Ruth Millikan in which she maintains that other sorts of representational states have this sort of content (13-17).) Or they might say that Elder is wrong about the truth conditions for such judgments: all that it takes for such judgments to be true is for their indicative contents to be true. Or they might concede that the judgments are false, but maintain that all the explosivist needs is for the indicative contents of these judgments to be true (e.g., the proposition that an incar ceased to exist when the car left the garage). Moreover, if any of these responses are successful, then they would undermine an important part of Elder's case against stage theory as well, since the above argument also constitutes Elder's only objection to stage theorists who embrace explosivism (§4.1). So it is surprising that Elder does not address any of these fairly natural responses.

The Argument from Vagueness

Another of Elder's targets is universalism (chapter 7). Universalism is the thesis that composition is unrestricted: for every plurality of objects (of any kind, in any arrangement), there is something composed of those objects. So, among other things, the handle and head that now compose the hammer already composed something even before the hammer was ever assembled, when they were on opposite ends of the workbench.

One of the most influential arguments for universalism is the argument from vagueness. Suppressing some key premises that won't concern us here, the argument runs as follows:

(A1) If universalism is false, then it is possible for there to be borderline cases of composition.

(A2) Necessarily, if there are borderline cases of composition, then it is indeterminate how many objects exist.

(A3) It cannot be indeterminate how many objects exist.

(A4) So, universalism is true.

The idea behind A1 is that if (contra universalism) composition is restricted, then one can construct a sorites series leading from a case in which composition occurs to a case in which it doesn't occur -- for instance, a moment-by-moment series leading from the beginning to the end of the assembly of the hammer. On pain of an intolerable sharp cut-off, there will have to be some point in such a series at which it is vague whether composition occurs. The idea behind A2 is that there is an intimate connection between composition and the number of things. If the handle and head compose something, then there are three things (ignoring the parts of the handle and head): the handle, the head, and the hammer. So if it is indeterminate whether they compose anything, then it stands to reason that it will be indeterminate whether there are three things or only two. The idea behind A3 is that one can make claims about how many objects exist using only logical expressions (e.g., ∃x∃y(x≠y & ∀z(x=z v y=z))), none of which looks to be a possible source of vagueness or indeterminacy. (See Sider, Four-Dimensionalism, §4.9.1 for a more detailed defense of the argument.)

Much of the controversy surrounding the argument from vagueness has focused on A3 and, in particular, the possibility of vague quantifiers -- and Elder likewise has concerns about A3 (144-145). But Elder also raises an interesting challenge to A2, by calling attention to cases in which some things are a borderline case of composing some stuff. For instance, suppose that some microscopic items are a borderline case of composing some butter. It may well be that whether or not they compose some butter will make a difference to how much stuff there is in the world. But, Elder argues, it will not make a difference to how many objects there are: even when one definitely has some butter, there can be no sensible answer to the question of how many parcels or portions or bits of butter one has (146-147). So this would appear to be a counterexample to A2: a case of borderline composition without indeterminacy in the number of objects.

Elder's reasoning might be resisted in various ways. One might insist that questions about the number of portions of butter do have definite answers, but that it would not be sensible to try to count the portions because there are so damn many of them (arguably one for each plurality of butterfat globules). Or one might insist that the cases Elder has in mind are not genuine cases of borderline composition: the microparticles definitely compose something (some stuff), and all that is indeterminate is whether the stuff that they definitely compose counts as butter.

But defenders of the argument from vagueness can avoid getting dragged into these debates about stuff by simply revising A1 and A2 as follows:

(A1') If universalism is false, then it is possible for there to be borderline cases of composing an object.

(A2') Necessarily, if there are borderline cases of composing an object, then it is indeterminate how many objects exist.

A1' seems to be in just as good standing as A1. And if Elder is right that his butter case is a genuine case of borderline composition without being a borderline case of some things composing an object, then the case is no threat to A2'.

The Overdetermination Argument

One of the most intriguing parts of the book is Elder's response to the overdetermination argument for the elimination of ordinary objects. Here is the argument as it applies to baseballs:

(B1) Every event either is or is not caused by atoms arranged baseballwise.

(B2) If an event is caused by atoms arranged baseballwise, then it isn't caused by a baseball.

(B3) If an event isn't caused by atoms arranged baseballwise, then it isn't caused by a baseball.

(B4) If no events are caused by baseballs, then there are no baseballs.

(B5) So there are no baseballs.

The idea behind B2 is that we shouldn't take window-shatterings and other such events that are supposed to be caused by baseballs to be systematically overdetermined by baseballs and their atomic parts. The idea behind B3 is that the events that are supposed to be caused by baseballs can always be accounted for in terms of the activities of microscopic items. These together with B1 entail that baseballs don't cause anything to happen, in which case we arguably have no reason to believe that they exist. (See Merricks, Objects and Persons, chapter 3 for a more detailed defense of the argument.)

Much of the controversy surrounding this argument has centered on B2: even if certain sorts of overdetermination are objectionable, there's nothing so bad about overdetermination by an object and its parts. Elder, however, grants B2 and instead challenges B3. His strategy is to articulate and defend a theory of causation that, he contends, yields the result that window-shatterings are caused by baseballs and are not caused by their atomic parts (§6.3).

Without going into the many intricacies of Elder's argument, his reasoning (in rough outline) runs as follows. On the proposed theory of causation, effects are counterfactually dependent on their causes in such a way that large or small changes to relevant features of the cause would have resulted in correspondingly large or small changes to relevant features of the effect (chapter 5, esp. 101). Altering the speed of the baseball to a greater or lesser degree would have altered the violence with which the window shattered to a correspondingly greater or lesser degree (129). But, Elder contends, there is no sense to be made of altering the associated microphysical events to a "greater or lesser degree". He attempts to evoke bafflement about such comparisons by inviting the reader to judge which of various seemingly incommensurable changes to the activities of the atoms count as a "greater or lesser" change (130).

There's something fishy about this line of reasoning. Even if one cannot sensibly compare every sort of variation of the atoms for greater or lesser change (surely the same could be said for baseballs), there do look to be at least some dimensions along which the activities of atoms admit of the sort of variation that could underwrite the requisite counterfactual dependence relations. For instance, the speed at which the atoms arranged baseballwise are hurtling towards the window evidently covaries with the violence of the shattering in precisely the same way that the speed of the baseball covaries with the violence of the shattering. If the latter suffices for causation, why doesn't the former? Elder never addresses the question.

Perhaps Elder chooses not to engage with this natural line of response on account of his objections to the use of such locutions as 'atoms arranged baseballwise'. In §6.1, he argues convincingly that if we understand 'atoms arranged baseballwise' to mean something like atoms that are collectively disposed to cause experiences as of a baseball, then the term will designate the wrong pluralities of atoms (by, among other things, including atoms lying between the observer and the baseball). In order to designate the appropriate atoms, Elder contends, the term must instead be used to mean something like atoms that are in a region occupied by a baseball. But this gloss obviously isn't available to eliminativists, since by their lights there are no such atoms. (This, by the way, is what Elder is alluding to in the title of his book: theorizing about arrangements of atoms while denying the existence of the objects that they compose is meant to be analogous to postulating shadows while denying the existence of the sources of those shadows.)

There would seem to be a way of steering between the horns of this dilemma. The eliminativist can say that atoms are arranged baseballwise iff they instantiate the properties and relations upon which, if per impossible baseballs existed, their composing a baseball would non-trivially supervene. Elder considers and rejects this proposal, but his discussion of it is disappointingly brief. He contends that this response commits one to the view that one can "fairly readily" give a nonvacuous specification of the conditions under which atoms arranged baseballwise compose a baseball, and that this in turn would undermine the eliminativist's reasons for accepting B4 of the overdetermination argument (115). But he says nothing in defense of these claims, neither of which is especially plausible on its face.

One last thing: Readers who are unfamiliar with this literature should bear in mind that Elder has a somewhat idiosyncratic take on the popularity of eliminativism. He refers to eliminativism as "the dominant metaphysical agenda", and claims that "very, very few philosophers currently working in metaphysics defend the reality of such familiar objects [as stars and tennis shoes]" (140-1). And he's just wrong about that. (Even in his own bibliography, the permissivists outnumber the eliminativists -- and that's not even counting defenders of the ordinary conception.) The truth is that eliminativists occupy a role in contemporary metaphysics similar to that of the skeptic in contemporary epistemology. There are powerful arguments for the position, but only a few brave souls have been willing to accept their conclusions. The rest of us are convinced that the arguments fail (even if we can't agree about where exactly they go wrong), but we continue to take the arguments seriously in the hope that, by identifying their flaws, we might learn something about material objects.

I have raised some objections, but none of them can be said to "strike at the heart" of Elder's project. I would still encourage those interested in material-object metaphysics to have a look at the book. Even if the arguments aren't ultimately persuasive, they certainly deserve to be addressed, and with greater care and attention to detail than I have been able to give them here.[1]

[1] Thanks to Chad Carmichael and Laurie Paul for valuable discussion.