Families of Virtue: Confucian and Western Views on Childhood Development

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Erin M. Cline, Families of Virtue: Confucian and Western Views on Childhood Development, Columbia University Press, 2015, 342pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231171557 .

Reviewed by David B. Wong, Duke University


This book attributes to early Confucianism the view that the parent-child relationship has a "unique and irreplaceable" role in early moral development (xi) and goes on to argue that this view is right. In the course of making this argument Erin M. Cline provides careful and perceptive comparative readings of early Confucian texts and a very wide range of texts in the Western tradition, from Plato, Aristotle, Locke, and Rousseau to contemporary feminists, to show how unusual and in-depth the insights of Confucian thinkers were. She draws from a wide range of empirical studies to support the Confucian view. There is much in this book that will be of value to anyone with interests in the fields of the philosophy and psychology of moral development, feminist care ethics, and comparative ethics. Cline's comparison of Confucian and feminist views, which have the most to say about parent-child relationships, is informative and balanced. It is not clear that she has fully established the unique and irreplaceable role of the parent-child relationship, but Cline surely has given enough argument to establish that the relationship is one of the most important factors, perhaps the most important single factor, in moral development, and she raises good questions as to why U.S. society largely neglects its importance in its public policies.

When Cline says that the early parent-child relationship is unique and irreplaceable, she does not mean that all is lost if one does not get the early childhood experiences provided by the preferred moral upbringing. She allows that one might be able to mitigate and manage the problems that arise. She says, "those experiences can never be replaced," and "as a result, the process through which an adult might address these problems, as well as the outcome of that attempt, will differ in significant ways from how the matter is approached by someone who did encounter these lessons in early childhood" (58).

More clarification of this qualification is in order. Is Cline suggesting that deficits will continue to exist even if problems arising from the early parent-child relationship are "addressed" at some later time? Is she suggesting that such deficits can be eliminated with great effort, much help from others, and good luck? Is she suggesting that a person who does recover may nevertheless be fragile? All these are plausible possibilities, which gets realized may well depend on what specifically children are exposed to or deprived of, and on the different temperaments to which they are genetically disposed. Given that Cline's qualification to "unique and irreplaceable" seems significant and subject to different variations, it might have been better to assert the great importance of the early parent-child relationship for moral development, or to go a bit stronger, that it is the single most influential factor in moral development. Other factors, such as genetic predispositions toward certain temperaments, the presence of people other than the parents in the family or outside the family, during early childhood and later, are significant. The extent of their influence and their interaction with each other and the parent-child relationship needs to be better understood. Furthermore, the somewhat weaker claim about the importance of the parent-child relationship seems truer to the range of views expressed in the early Confucian texts.

The classical Confucian texts most likely to be known outside the Chinese tradition are the Analects, the Mencius (or Mengzi), and the Xunzi. They most often focus on the moral cultivation of adults. In the case of the Analects, for example, Confucius and his students, all adult men, discuss how to cultivate moral excellence in their own persons and in rulers. Their project involves taking conscious control of their own development and trying to shape their emotional dispositions through reflection and deliberate practice in ritual activity. The presumption that much crucial moral shaping of one's character can take place well into adulthood is illustrated by Confucius' account of his moral life-journey (Analects 2.4):

From fifteen, my heart-mind was set upon learning; from thirty I took my stance; from forty I was no longer doubtful; from fifty I realized the propensities of Heaven; from sixty my ear was attuned; from seventy I could give my heart-mind free rein without overstepping the boundaries.

Passages in all three of these texts also assert or imply the importance of the early parent-child relationship for moral cultivation, but as Cline notes, this is not the same as saying that it is "unique and irreplaceable" (57). There is, as she also notes, not much said about the character of the preferred type of early parent-child relationship other than suggestions that love is reciprocal, parents guide with the welfare of children in mind, and gratitude and reverence is expected of children. The importance placed on filial piety, together with the detailed attention paid to what it should be like, often concerns the reverence and service that adult children should show towards their parents. Filial piety, as a virtue of young children and of adults, is taken as a foundation for developing other virtues. How one learns to relate to members of one's family is taken to be a model for and especially influential on one's relationships in larger communities.

Cline turns to other classical Confucian texts to get ideas closer to the claim that the early parent-child relationship, indeed, even including the prenatal period, is unique and irreplaceable for moral development. For example, in Protecting and Tutoring, it is said that the fate of the people depends on the crown prince, and the quality of the crown prince is determined by early instruction and the selection of the prince's attendants. In Discourse on the States and Collected Biographies of Women, moral influence is attributed to prenatal cultivation, including the right sort of music and chanting. The Confucian texts that Cline considers, then, contain a "family of views," related to each other but not the same (58), some of them focusing on development in the prenatal, infancy and early childhood more than other texts and making more explicit and seemingly stronger claims for the importance of what happens during this early period.

In her comparative discussion of early Confucian views with a range of thinkers in the Western tradition, Cline observes that some Western views do pay attention to the family's influence on moral cultivation. Aristotle, Cicero, and Seneca clearly think children should feel gratitude toward parents and have a conception of filial piety, but their accounts do not give these matters the emphasis and attention that early Confucians do (the latter, for example, express an understanding of the highly unique nature of the debt children owe to their parents in virtue of the nurturance received). Locke, an exception to the Western rule, held that children very much need moral education, in the form of restraint, correction, and support, which parents have a unique responsibility to provide. His conception of filial piety includes feelings of reverence as well as emotional and material support for parents in their older age. Women have an equal claim to reverence and authority in the family.

Cline's survey makes a strong case for her conclusion that Western philosophy tends not to give sustained attention to the family, in particular to parent-child relationships, in the process of moral cultivation. One notable exception in the West is contemporary feminist care ethics. About twenty years ago, Chenyang Li initiated much discussion and debate through his comparison of the Confucian value of ren 仁 (variously translated as "benevolence," "humanity," "humaneness," "human-heartedness") with the feminist value of care. According to Li, each value centrally features an affective conception of relationships and embodies the highest moral ideal in their respective ethics.

Cline pays much attention to Sara Ruddick's analysis of the critical work of "mothering" for moral development. One difference between Ruddick and (some of) the early Confucians is that she does not declare the early years of childhood to be critical for moral development. Ruddick also differs from Confucians in her criticism of traditional gender roles and her recommendation that the activity of caring for children be called "mothering," even when performed by men, since she believes that any attempt to preserve a distinct activity of "fathering" (even a reformed activity that tries to be more in accord with gender equality) will end up reinforcing traditional male domination and authority. Cline points out that Confucians have too much regard for tradition to reject it wholesale, and instead would advocate incremental change towards a kind of fathering that shares equally in the work of caring for children.

The Confucian value of harmony, Cline says, "encourages and perhaps even requires complementarity" in roles for different family members in the raising of children (162). Her conception of complementarity is pretty liberal: different family members might perform different tasks or the same tasks in different ways, according to their particular traits, tendencies, and strengths (163). This does not require division of work by gender, and she grants that some might question that her kind of harmony is properly called 'Confucian'. Cline replies that any contemporary Confucian view is going to look pretty different from traditional views. On the other hand, she notes that a Confucian approach would not reject out of hand the idea that there are differences between men and women -- whether biologically determined or culturally constructed -- and that these differences needn't justify patriarchy or oppression (165).

Cline suggests that feminists and Confucians can learn from each other. Feminists can push Confucians to engage with the range of possibilities that are open to women and to men for full sharing in child care. Confucians can also learn from Nel Noddings' idea that gratitude between parents and children should go both ways, not just from children to parents. Confucians can encourage care ethicists to attend more fully to the role of pregnancy and early childhood in moral cultivation.

The penultimate chapter presents empirical evidence that Cline takes to confirm the uniqueness and irreplaceability of the prenatal and early parent-child relationship for moral development. She says that early childhood intervention programs share with the Confucians the assumption that children's earliest experiences play a fundamental role in shaping their life opportunities and that parent caregiving provides the most important of these earliest experiences. Her particular focus is on a maternal and early childhood health program known as the Nurse-Family Partnership (NFP), begun 37 years ago. Focused on enrolling women who are low-income, unmarried and adolescents, the program partners first-time mothers with specially trained nurses who visit them throughout their pregnancies and until the child turns two. Program goals for mothers include employment, reducing use of tobacco, alcohol, and illegal drugs, developing healthy eating habits, identifying obstetric complications and seeking treatment properly, and learning how to provide sensitive, competent care for infants (reading and responding to babies' communicative signals, playing with them in ways that promote emotional and cognitive development, and creating a household safe for children). Randomized, controlled studies of the effects of the program showed that mothers in the program had better prenatal health and behavior, decreased use of welfare, Medicaid and food stamps, fewer behavioral impairments due to substance use, and fewer parenting attitudes that predispose them to abuse their children. Their children were less likely to be hospitalized with injuries through age 2, less likely to have behavioral problems at school entry; and less likely to reveal depression, anxiety and substance use at age 12.

Cline describes in useful detail the theory underpinning the program and connects it with Confucian views. The ecological theory of Urie Bronfenbrenner highlights the role that relationships, not just parent-child relationships, play in the human capacity to change and develop. Parents' care of infants is influenced by their relationships with other family and friends, and interrelations between their social networks, neighborhoods, communities, and cultures. NFP nurses aim to help women identify the aspects of their children's social environment that they can influence and to take a proactive role in selecting and shaping these contexts. Cline points out a relevant parallel to the traditional story of "Mencius' mother's three moves." Mencius' mother moved the family from their first two neighborhoods because she did not like the way the surroundings were influencing her son. She was satisfied when she moved the family next to a school and saw how the models of conduct her son found there began to influence him.

One of the reasons for the NFP's focus on getting first-time mothers into the program is that these women are undergoing what Bronfenbrenner calls an ecological transition: a period of major role change during which a person might be the most susceptible to change. A relevant comparative point is that a major part of the moral cultivation programs of the Confucians is an appeal to live up to one's social roles (Analects 12.11: "Let the ruler be a ruler, the minister be a minister, the father be a father, and the son be a son"). Cline observes that becoming a parent is a unique opportunity to become a better person (216). One matter of potential concern, however, is that she tends to focus on the way that the total complex of relationships influences the child through its impact on the parents or through decisions they make as to what their children should be exposed to. But an effective and caring teacher in a child's school might be a sustaining resource to a child neglected or even mistreated at home.

Cline turns to John Bowlby's attachment theory to support the idea of the unique and irreplaceable role of parent-child relationship in development of the child. A central theme of his theory is that mothers who are consistently responsive to their infants' physical and emotional needs provide a sense of security in them and a base from which they can explore the world. The securely attached fare better emotionally, socially and intellectually. The ramifications continue long after childhood because attachment-related experiences get encoded in 'internal working models' of self and others that give rise to styles of emotional communication and relationships.

Cline takes the NFP study and its theoretical underpinning as confirming Confucian views. It must be said, however, that the Confucian texts do not state a theory of moral development anywhere near as specific as attachment or ecological theory. She does cite one passage from the Book of Rites that says the crown prince's teacher should be distinguished for her "generosity of mind, gentle kindness, her mild integrity, her respectful bearing, and her carefulness" and "freedom from talkativeness" (59). Such a person might be one of the attachment theory's caregivers who foster secure attachment, but some inference is required to make this connection. Further, Cline points out that attachment theory brings out something important that Confucianism needs to take on board: that the child's feelings and attitudes toward the parents are a response to the parent's caregiving. Confucian classics could pay more attention to the virtues of good parental care, to balance its tremendous emphasis on filial piety. While one cannot anachronistically read a contemporary theory of early childhood development into early Confucian views, it does seem fair to say that the ecological and attachment theories provide one way of extending and spelling out in much more detail what some of the early Confucian views might be suggesting about the importance of prenatal and early parent-child relationship for moral and other forms of development.

The Book of Rites passage raises another issue. It is clear that the ideal caregiver described there need not be the crown prince's mother (recall also the Mencius passage on fathers not teaching sons). Yet Cline's consistent language for the crucial early relationship is "parent-child" relationship. In traditional Chinese families, in fact, it was and is not unusual for grandparents to perform much of the child rearing. Cline approvingly describes Rousseau's criticism of parents and of a social structure that allows them to hand over care and education of children to others. She suggests we need to "think through" institutions such as boarding school and day care and lack of adequate parental leave (132). The inclusion of day care indicates that Cline leans at times toward a pretty strong interpretation of the irreplaceability of parents in the moral education of the child. While it must be granted that the substantial use of day care is often a sign of lack of sufficient interest in and commitment to one's children, it isn't always. Mencius states that fathers should not try to give moral instruction to their sons because they get angry when they try to correct their sons (4A18). Sons will get angry in return and accuse their fathers of not being correct in their own persons, and the two sides end up hurting one another. One does not have to completely agree with this sweeping pronouncement to acknowledge that people other than parents can significantly contribute to the care and education of young children. (see also 253).

Many contemporary parents agonize over the choice between personally providing good care for their children and pursuing full-time careers with the monetary support they bring in for the family. The United States is virtually alone among economically advanced societies in not requiring paid parental leave. Even if this policy were to change, use of day care would likely remain substantial, and its acceptability a charged issue.

Day care givers who are sensitive and responsive to children, who are not given too many children to care for, and who are around long enough to establish relationships with them, might be an asset rather than a liability to children's moral development. It is true that the most serious study of day care in the United States shows some evidence of increase in behavior problems with increase in time spent in day care (NICHD 2006). On the other hand, the effects are not large, and family characteristics, apart from use of daycare, are stronger predictors of a child's social behavior and development. The revealed negative effects of using more day care may reflect the quality available in the United States. A study of early childcare in Australia, where formal childcare is better regulated, did not yield the negative results revealed in the U.S. study (Love et al 2003). Others have suggested that day care centers, pre-schools and early elementary school could be productively restructured to foster attachment relationships not only with teachers and other staff but among the children themselves, as has been done in countries such as Japan (Macoby and Lewis 2003).

More knowledge about the total ecology of child development is needed, and calling the parent-child relationship unique and irreplaceable might mask how much more needs to be known to help shape the best policies. It was Confucius, after all, who acknowledged the powerful influence of friends on one's character by saying that one should not have friends who are not as good as oneself (Analects 1.8), and Xunzi who declared that if one does not know a man, one should look at his friends (Xunzi, chapter 23). Furthermore, there is a lot of variation in how well children manage various forms of adversity such as genetic predispositions to mental illness, stressful experiences such as war, neglect or mistreatment by caregivers, and low socioeconomic status. Some who are neglected or mistreated by their parents manage well because of good relationships with other people in their lives (e.g., other family members or friends ). Late bloomers, who recover between age ten to adulthood, not only tend to find such crucial others after early childhood, but also often find opportunities in jobs or the military that enable them to find lives of meaning and purpose (Masten 2014).

The final chapter addresses U.S. society and its dedicating relatively few resources to support the quality of parent-child relationships. Given the evidence that those relationships have a greater influence on a person's overall capacity to flourish in life than any other single factor, why don't we act on it? Cline points out that the most prominent contemporary theories of distributive justice, such as John Rawls' theory of justice as fairness, tend to focus on the injustice of material inequality. This focus pairs with relative neglect of the quality of relationships in a society and how they powerfully influence people's well being. Cline also observes a tendency in the West to value meeting the needs of the many over the needs of one's special relations. We should keep in mind, she urges, the profound impact one can make on one's own children. It often is assumed that it is easier to care for one's own children. But good parents regularly set aside and sacrifice their own personal and professional needs and desires for the well being of their children (249).

Cline observes that many if not most people in the U.S. would nevertheless acknowledge the importance of family relationships in early childhood. The problem is that these "views are not reflected in our policies or in the widespread attitudes and practices found within our culture" (253). She suggests that deeper cultural change is required for policies to change. More men need to be sufficiently committed to their roles as parents so as to demand paid parental leave. Confucianism can help with effecting the deeper cultural change, suggests Cline. Stories and anecdotes, such as used in Confucian texts, can be effective in changing habits of thought. It is difficult to argue with these suggestions, and Cline's book on the whole is a refreshing and effective argument that Confucian views of moral development can help us renew our attention and turn our wills to the task of improving some of the most important relationships that affect human well-being.

However, the requisite change may require more than presenting the right ideas in an appealing way, and the Confucian texts may have another lesson to teach in this regard. These texts express appreciation for the importance of habits of the heart, and not just of thought, in motivating right conduct. They prescribe programs for restoring a culture of practices and institutions that would cultivate the most helpful emotional dispositions. We may already know in some sense about the importance of early caregiver-child relationships, but we get too easily distracted by matters such as short-term financial considerations. We might well ask how we could restructure our daily practices and institutions so as to motivate us to act more effectively on what we know to be more important.


My thanks to Chenyang Li, Jin Li, and Maureen Perry-Jenkins for discussions and information about relevant literature.


Love, John M. et al. 2003. "Child Care Quality Matters: How Conclusions May Vary With Context." Child Development 74, no. 4: 1021 -- 1033.

National Institute of Child Health and Human Development (NICHD). 2006. The NICHD Study of Early Child Care and Youth Development: Findings for Children Ages Birth to 4 ½ Years. NIH Pub. No. 05-4318.

Maccoby, Eleanor E. and Catherine C. Lewis. 2003. "Less Day Care or Different Day Care?" Child Development 74, no. 4: 1069 -- 1075.

Masten, Ann S. 2014. Ordinary Magic: Resilience in Development. New York: Guilford Press.