Fashionable Nihilism: A Critique of Analytic Philosophy

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Wilshire, Bruce, Fashionable Nihilism: A Critique of Analytic Philosophy, State University of New York Press, 2002, 171pp, $18.95 (pbk), ISBN 0791454304.

Reviewed by David Hoekema, Calvin College


In the popular mind, Nietzsche is often reviled as an apologist for nihilism. Bruce Wilshire reminds us that this is far from the truth. Indeed, no thinker of the 19th century raised more alarm bells than did Nietzsche concerning the nihilistic tendencies of modern thought. In a striking headnote to the preface of this collection of essays, Wilshire quotes Nietzsche’s warning in The Will to Power that European culture is moving “as toward catastrophe: restlessly, violently, headlong, like a river that wants to reach the end, that no longer reflects, that is afraid to reflect.” One can discern in “the history of the next two centuries,” Nietzsche writes, “what is coming, what can no longer come differently: the advent of nihilism.” In his judgment, every attempt to preserve meaning in human life by invoking religious or moral dogma only accelerated the collapse of all hope, since theology and morality were no more than comforting modes of self-deception.

Bruce Wilshire argues, in the first few essays collected here, that the catastrophe Nietzsche foresaw has arrived even sooner than he predicted it would, within the span of one century rather than two. The intellectual world of the universities has embraced nihilism and cannot imagine an alternative. Worst of all, those who are principally responsible for this development are those who should be its most stalwart opponents. It is not unwashed barbarians, Hollywood moguls, or talk-show hosts who have emptied our lives of the possibility of genuine meaning. It is philosophers, and in particular the oligarchic cabal of analytic philosophers who control philosophy conferences, journals, and graduate programs in the United States, who have ushered in the catastrophe that Nietzsche envisioned. Contemporary Western civilization is in a state of advanced decay, and philosophers who regard their discipline as dedicated to systematic and logical resolution of narrowly defined “problems,” Wilshire argues, are principally at fault.

These are grave charges to level at a disciplinary community that, to an outsider, might appear to have little visibility and less influence in contemporary cultural life. Wilshire argues on the contrary that the influence of philosophy in the past century has been pervasive and deeply destructive. The analytic mode of contemporary Anglo-American philosophy, on his view, represents a disastrous marriage of scientific positivism and philosophical myopia that has done irreparable damage to undergraduate and graduate students of philosophy, hence to the vitality and character of North American scholarship and thought in general. Some of his most pointed accusations are cast in the form of rhetorical questions, but his drift is unmistakable: philosophy has lost its central purpose and has become a destructive rather than a constructive force in contemporary intellectual life. To rescue the discipline and put contemporary intellectual culture back on a constructive path, Wilshire pleads, demands that we recover the broader vision of the nature of philosophy that was embraced not only by Nietzsche but also by several other figures from the last two centuries, including the pragmatists and phenomenologists of the New World.

But what if it could be shown that philosophers who function within analytic traditions tend to reflect on self in a way that unwittingly impoverishes and objectifies self in one way or another? With the consequence that we organisms’ immediate valuations and emotional involvements in the world, and angles on and in it, are obscured? … Kierkegaard, William James, Thoreau, and others I admire are very close to Nietzsche in his condemnation of philosophers who will not or cannot reflect on their own presuppositions: that is, wholly professionalized philosophers. I display grounds for their condemnation in many analytic philosophers’ behavior today. I think that in gradually losing the power of fitting, apt, and determined reflection on one’s own self, they lose not just an old-fashioned homey demeanor and atmosphere. They slide blithely into nihilism. (“Preface,” pp. xii-xiv)

These are strong words, and if Wilshire is to make his charges stick he must offer a substantial and credible body of evidence for their truth. Does he do so? Yes and no. A sympathetic reader will find a good deal of material in the diverse essays collected here that helps to substantiate the accusations, but it falls well short of a clearly developed case for the prosecution. A more skeptical reader may wonder whether the incidents and tendencies cited add up to anything more sinister than insensitivity and narrow-mindedness on the part of certain individuals and departments.

But even if he fails to clinch the case for the prosecution, Wilshire has a good deal to offer on the positive side of his project. He conveys vividly and sometimes eloquently the breadth of philosophical vision and the union of head and heart found in some of the writings of major figures who fall outside the dominant analytic tradition, such as Edie and Wild, and in the American pragmatists such as Dewey and James. The essay placed second in this volume is a reaffirmation of James’s warning against “the Ph.D. octopus” that substitutes a narrow and technical set of skills for the cultivation of a deeper understanding of moral identity. Many readers will come away from this book unconvinced by Wilshire’s animadversions against the philosophers he dislikes but intrigued by the insights he gleans from those whose work he champions.

One major flaw in Wilshire’s case for the prosecution is his failure to identify his adversary clearly. Indeed, in the opening essay on “Nihilistic Consequences of Analytic Philosophy,” he informs us that he has principled reasons for avoiding any clear definition of the opposing camp. “Rather than the old standby of attempting to define by adducing necessary and sufficient conditions for applying terms,” he writes, “I will apply a kind of ostensive procedure… . Actual instances of the ‘analytic’ habit of mind will appear in concrete situations.” (p. 2)

He offers three such examples intended to tell us what analytic philosophy is. The first is an elevator conversation at a philosophy convention, reported to him by a third party, in which several graduate students comment sneeringly on the immaturity of anyone who “confuses philosophy with things that matter in their little lives.” The second is the manifest bias of the self-pronounced “Philosophical Gourmet Report: A Ranking of Graduate Programs in the English-speaking World,” compiled by Brian Leiter, who has a joint appointment in philosophy and law, and published on-line by Blackwell (see Leiter’s guide, to which Wilshire attributes great influence among administrators as well as prospective students, is biased strongly toward analytic approaches, and it has been the subject of vehement accusations and recriminations in philosophical circles. (Wilshire does not cite one of the most troublesome examples of its misuse: when the recently deceased magazine Lingua Franca prepared its generally excellent Real Guide to Grad School, its philosophy section relied far too heavily on Leiter’s often idiosyncratic ratings but failed to acknowledge their slant.) Third, Wilshire cites by name a major university whose doctoral program in philosophy, strongly analytic in character, requires no comprehensive exam and no dissertation to qualify for the Ph.D., only “a few analytic gems, polished, tight exhibits of analytic skill in argumentation.” (p. 3)

These examples show that analytic philosophers, and philosophers in training, are sometimes maddeningly narrow in their thinking. This is hardly news, nor does it distinguish one philosophical or disciplinary camp from another. Hegelians, Deweyans, Jamesians and Sartreans, like Marxists and Lacanians and Freudians, zealous to defend their own insights, have all lapsed at times into insularity and crankiness toward their competitors. When Wilshire assures us that the three examples provide “all we need to sketch initially the meaning of ‘analytic philosophy,’” we have to conclude that to be an analytic philosopher is to display an attitude of smug superiority to everyone less clever than oneself. As a definition of a philosophical movement, this is a little thin.

Later, to be sure, Wilshire does tick off in passing some further characteristics of the analytic movement. Analytic philosophers “divide the emotive from the cognitive, and the moral from the factual,” and it is their “endemic weakness” to make “overly simple and rigid distinctions.” (p. 8) They embrace Descartes’ “whole glittering trove of reified abstractions and hypostatized nouns for mental ‘contents’—sensations, images and such,” which leads them to embrace “phenomenalism” but to fail to grasp the necessity of “phenomenology,” the exploration of experience as it is lived by actual subjects. Analytic philosophers ignore Hegel, and they know far too little of Kant (p. 12).

Some or all of these charges may be true, but they do not add up to a very clear definition of analytic philosophy and how it differs from the alternatives. For that one could do worse than excerpt a paragraph or two from the reviled Leiter report, which in its 2000-2001 edition attempted to explain and justify its avowed preference for analytic philosophy:

“Analytic” philosophy today names a style of doing philosophy, not a philosophical program or a set of substantive views. Analytic philosophers, crudely speaking, aim for argumentative clarity and precision; draw freely on the tools of logic; and often identify, professionally and intellectually, more closely with the sciences and mathematics, than with the humanities… . The foundational figures of this tradition are philosophers like Gottlob Frege, Bertrand Russell, the young Ludwig Wittgenstein and G.E. Moore; other canonical figures include Carnap, Quine, Davidson, Kripke, Rawls, Dummett, and Strawson.
“Continental” philosophy, by contrast, demarcates a group of French and German philosophers of the 19th and 20th centuries. The geographical label is misleading: Carnap, Frege, and Wittgenstein were all products of the European Continent, but are not “Continental” philosophers. The foundational figure of this tradition is Hegel; other canonical figures include the other post-Kantian German Idealists (e.g., Fichte), Schopenhauer, Kierkegaard, Marx, Nietzsche, Husserl, Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, Sartre, Gadamer, Horkheimer, Adorno, Marcuse, Habermas, and Foucault. Continental philosophy is distinguished by its style (more literary, less analytical, sometimes just obscure), its concerns (more interested in actual political and cultural issues and, loosely speaking, the human situation and its “meaning”), and some of its substantive commitments (more self-conscious about the relation of philosophy to its historical situation).

This is by no means a neutral account of the distinction, but it is not far from the mark. Leiter goes on to make a number of remarks, many of them disparaging, about the quality of philosophical thought and writing of those who label themselves Continental philosophers, but he also directs at his own camp some of the same charges that Wilshire lodges.

Analytic philosophers generally become unbearably trite and superficial once they venture beyond the technical problems and methods to which their specialized training best suits them, and try to assume the mantle of “public intellectual” so often associated with figures on the Continent. The best analytic philosophers are usually very smart (clever, quick, analytically acute), but less often deep. A reflective, literate person will still find far more nourishment from the writings of Schopenhauer or Nietzsche, than from the attempts of some “analytic” philosophers to become free-lance social critics or purveyors of existential wisdom. (Source:

Why, one wonders frequently in reading Wilshire’s essays, does he construe the differences of subject, style and temperament that separate these two traditions as a battle between Manichean forces of light and powers of darkness? An important part of the answer is contained in his account, published here for the first time, of “The Pluralist Rebellion in the American Philosophical Association,” a development at the 1978 and 1979 meetings of the Eastern Division of the APA that provided the discipline of philosophy with perhaps its most prominent, if least welcome, coverage in national news media. Wilshire’s account of this episode is worth reading, not because it provides a complete or unbiased account of a tumultuous chapter in the annals of academic philosophy, but rather because it conveys so vividly the passionate sense of disenfranchisement that Wilshire and his colleagues working in Continental philosophy and American pragmatism felt at that time. His account also discloses the ways in which others’ attempts to seek a middle ground served only to exacerbate the tensions.

The story is a familiar one to me, from others’ reports and not from first-hand observation. When I became Executive Director of the American Philosophical Association in 1984, the repercussions of the 1979 coup were readily evident in the affairs of the Eastern Division. What had happened, in brief, was that a loose alliance of adherents of post-Hegelian Continental philosophy or American pragmatism came together to challenge the continued dominance of analytic philosophers in the largest of the APA’s three regional divisions, whose influence they perceived not only in selection of papers for publication and presentation but even in the work of regional accrediting agencies. Many of the outsiders represented graduate programs at Yale, Fordham, SUNY at Stony Brook, the New School for Social Research, and other programs with a significant non-analytic presence. Tired of watching the leading analytic philosophers place their friends and protégés in key positions on other graduate faculties and association committees, they decided to take action. They were, in a word, mad as heck, and they weren’t going to take it any longer.

At the 1978 business meeting of the Eastern Division, customarily a sleepy occasion where a few reports are read and pro forma elections validate the choices of the nominating committee, the pluralist protesters packed the meeting hall with sympathetic colleagues alerted to the planned confrontation. From the floor, in response to a proposal to select from a short list of candidates for divisional offices, Wilshire and some of his colleagues demanded to know the full list of names suggested to the nominating committee, and they noted that philosophers on the list from outside the analytic camp had been excluded from nomination. In response, the dissenters nominated a new slate of candidates from the floor and succeeded in electing all but one to divisional offices. One year later, a similar scenario led to a different outcome, and the pluralists’ candidate, a leading exponent of existentialism, came in second to an analytic philosopher of science. But the Committee for Pluralism in the APA had been born, and for the next decade it played an important role in the annual elections of the Eastern Division, no less so after the procedure was moved from the floor of the business meeting to a mailed ballot. Each year the Committee’s organizers mailed out a list of recommended candidates for each election—initially only to those who requested their advice, but later, to ensure an atmosphere of openness, they purchased the entire divisional membership list for that purpose.

The voices of the protesters did not go unheard. “To their credit,” Wilshire writes, “some analytic philosophers accepted the results as a chastening reminder of tasks of philosophical explanation that many of them had ignored” (p. 59). Unfortunately he does not carry the story of the pluralist rebellion down to the present day, since what he includes in this 2002 collection is an essay written fifteen years earlier, with a brief prefatory note. He fails to take note of the efforts of leaders of the division, and of the national association as well, to make boards and committees broadly representative of the diverse philosophical schools present in American higher education, which led in the 1990’s to a decision by the leaders of the Committee for Pluralism to discontinue making specific recommendations for divisional elections. In effect, the analytic establishment had capitulated, and the rebellion had succeeded.

Carrying the story from the late 1970’s through the 1990’s would also have necessitated an account of the frequently fractious relations among the various groups who came together in support of greater breadth in APA leadership. For a time, Hegelians and Marxists joined hands with pragmatists and feminists to promote candidates, however distant from their own interests, who would bring greater diversity to APA leadership. Soon the seams holding the coalition together began to fray, and arguments within the pluralist camp became no less heated than its protests against the analytic establishment.

Through it all, however, the “pluralist presence” in American philosophy was growing more visible and more influential, whether measured in scholarly publishers’ annual book lists or in sessions at professional meetings. Today the annual meeting of the Society for Phenomenology and Existential Philosophy is one of the largest philosophical gatherings in the country, and few graduate programs remain exclusively analytic in orientation.

The remaining essays in the book will be of value to varying classes of readers. In a brief account of “Phenomenology in the United States,” Wilshire traces some major themes in the writings of Dewey, Peirce, and James through contemporary American phenomenology, with special emphasis on the contributions of James Edie and John Wild. A less familiar figure is the subject of another brief essay: Henry Bugbee, who wrote in a more aphoristic than a conventionally philosophical mode and whose contributions have, in Wilshire’s judgment, been unduly neglected. There is also an essay—a note, really, of just five pages—on what it is that James understood to be the spiritual dimension of human life.

Also included are an essay on Western and indigenous conceptions of nature and environment. The challenges that Wilshire offers to Western dichotomies between human and natural worlds are provocative, but unfortunately he makes extensive reference to some profundities attributed to historic Native American figures that, historians now believe, were made up by journalists. Another essay explores the nature and meaning of genocide, which Wilshire characterizes as a kind of pollution or infection of the brain when it functions as part of a social whole.

Interesting as they are, these essays seem to have little to do with the announced topic of the book, and do not advance the argument that analytic philosophy breeds nihilism. A final essay, even more loosely connected to the rest, is Wilshire’s moving account of his daughter’s abrupt death at the age of 31 and of the ways in which her life and death shaped the lives of those around her, even after her passing. I find nothing distinctively philosophical here, but there is much to ponder.

Fashionable Nihilism does not fulfill the promise of its subtitle. Even in the two or three essays that explicitly advance the critique of analytic philosophy, Wilshire argues only that analytic approaches systematically neglect fundamental questions of human meaning—a charge that some adherents would happily accept. In what way does the analytic approach, or the spirit of scientism out of which Wilshire believes it arises, make it impossible to find meaning in one’s life? We are never given an argument for this more sweeping conclusion. Are all of the practitioners of analytic philosophy of religion, for example—to cite an area of philosophy whose scope and influence have grown dramatically in recent decades—really apologists for nihilism? Wilshire evidently believes they are, but it is difficult to see why. It is in the evocation of the inclusive and holistic philosophical spirit that motivates recent work outside the analytic camp that Wilshire’s essays make their most valuable contribution.