Fatalism in American Film Noir: Some Cinematic Philosophy

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Robert B. Pippin, Fatalism in American Film Noir: Some Cinematic Philosophy, University of Virginia Press, 2012, 156pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780813931890.

Reviewed by Jerrold Levinson, University of Maryland


This slim volume is essentially a detailed and nuanced philosophical examination of three classics of American film noir, all from the very fateful 1940's: Jacques Tourneur's Out of the Past, Orson Welles's The Lady from Shanghai, and Fritz Lang's Scarlet Street. Though Pippin pays some attention to specific techniques of meaning-making in film, such as montage, framing, camera angle, and mise-en-scene, his primary focus is on eliciting clear accounts of what on the human level is actually going on in the films he examines, in terms of action, thought, and feeling, and then articulating philosophical perspectives on the human condition -- or at least that in post-war America -- that the films can be seen as exploring, or even advancing.

Pippin skillfully demonstrates that complex relations among ideas such as those of action, character, intention, self-control, and self-knowledge are undeniably part of the content of these strangely gripping cinematic tours de force, as is more overtly, the idea that the main characters in these claustrophobic scenarios are in some sense fated to do what they do. He convinces us that these films raise, if without definitively answering, questions about how these various notions are related, in what circumstances, and to what degree.

The book's main theme is the nature and conditions of agency, of what is required for and involved in ascription of actions to self and to others, and the conditions under which such ascriptions become tenuous, doubtful, or downright impossible. Pippin's analysis highlights the way in which the films chosen for examination give credence to the existentialist idea that persons are ultimately defined through their actions, however ostensibly motivated, rather than through the beliefs, thoughts, or rationales that may precede action. Relatedly, for Pippin, these fatalistic cinematic narratives all give the lie to a model of agency he labels the "reflective model", one already under attack at the time in philosophy and modernist literature, and which can be summarized as holding "that in acting I know what I am about and why I am about it . . . and that what I am doing is subject to some kind of deliberative control." (p. 14) If that is what full agency and full-fledged action require, then none of the protagonists in these films exemplify such. Yet in some sense they act, and fatefully.

But in what sense? Pippin underlines more than once the two-sidedness of the appeal to fate in these films. On the one hand, fate serves as shorthand for the psychological and physical forces against which characters struggle, mostly in vain, as well as for the unavoidable place of chance in how things turn out, and thus in a putatively explanatory capacity in relation to the actions of characters. On the other hand, fate serves characters as a ready-to-hand, always available justification for failing to act as they know they probably could and should. The appeal to fate in this sense is thus an exculpatory maneuver, disingenuous and self-serving to the core; in other words, 'it's just an alibi', as the old song "Big Girls Don't Cry" notably has it.

While not unpersuaded by Pippin's diagnosis in these films of the diminished capacity that renders their protagonists something less than fully agents and their often impulsive and not-well-thought-out doings rather less than genuine actions, I would offer a somewhat different slant on the peculiar agency on display. In the main, and apart from the physical and psychological constraints of the situations in which they find themselves, the driven and doomed behavior of these protagonists can be chalked up to both the multiplicity of their motivations for action and the divided selves that they harbor but only dimly acknowledge. More broadly, one can see these films as expressing the view that human situations are deeply many-sided, always subject to conflicting interpretations, and that human beings are deeply ambivalent and duplicitous, not the least to themselves. This would explain as much of what transpires in these grim narratives as the postulated collapse of the "reflective model" of agency, which perhaps never had much traction to begin with, or at least not since Descartes.

I now come to my main disagreement with Pippin, which concerns his reading of Scarlet Street and his effort to assimilate that film to the other two. For that assimilation obscures as much as it illuminates. Scarlet Street is rather different from the other two films, largely because its protagonist, Chris Cross, is a very different creature from the protagonists of Out of the Past and Lady from Shanghai, one who is "fated" to act as he does in a sense rather different from that which applies to the other two. Cross is not someone beset by conflicting motivations, as are Jeff Bailey and Michael O'Hara, but someone in the grip of two powerful and perfectly unambiguous ones -- amorous passion and creative joy. Whereas Bailey and O'Hara, fitfully in thrall to the femmes fatales of Out of the Past and Lady from Shanghai, are partially opaque to themselves, and wrestle with opposed feelings and desires, the feelings and desires that drive Cross are unqualified, not inherently opposed, and as transparent as can be. It is simply that he, unlike the other two, is entirely deluded (as regards the object of his amorous passion) and wholly deceived (as regards the upshot of his artistic efforts). The fact is that Cross, though tragically unaware of his capacity for violence, sees himself fairly clearly, but the world and its denizens, almost not at all. Cross at one point tellingly remarks, "that's one thing I could never master, perspective". This is the confession of someone who simply cannot see the world as it is, but only as he feels or imagines it. That description, though, is inapplicable to the other two protagonists, despite the false hopes and distortions of reality to which their conflicting desires and shaky hold on their selves make them subject.

Notwithstanding the doubts just expressed about the degree to which Scarlet Street is really of a piece with Out of the Past and Lady from Shanghai, one has to admire, and in broad strokes agree with, the picture Pippin gives us of partly opaque, partly deluded, partly unlucky, and thus not fully responsible, agents at the core of these films. What is less convincing to this reader, however, are the historicist and constructivist lessons about personhood and agency that Pippin urges on us in a short final chapter, and which he regards the films he has analyzed as adumbrating. I think that they are rather more credibly viewed as staging more or less universalistic claims about human nature, ones rooted in a subtler, post-Freudian and post-Hiroshima, picture of human psychology than was previously available. Acknowledging the partial opacity and shifting nature of the self, the powerful pull of confabulation in the service of desire, and the daunting complexity of human motivations, suffices largely to "explain the behavioral data" on display in these films, I suggest, without appeal to the sort of antirealism about action and agency to which Pippin seems drawn, epitomized in the idea that those are not factual conditions but just social statuses to be ascribed or withheld.

I note some missed opportunities in the book in light of both the specific cinematic repertoire it examines and its undisguised entry in the film-as-philosophy sweepstakes, though they do little to dim the book's overall success. There is first the failure to take account, in the discussion of Lang's Scarlet Street (1945), of the same director's Woman in the Window (1944), given how much the later film is foreshadowed by the earlier one, the virtually complete overlap in cast between the two films, and the prominent role played by a painted portrait of the femme fatale in both films. Second, there is the failure to make anything of the pivotal Acapulco beach scenes prominently featuring fishing nets -- symbols of entrapment going all the way back to Clytemnestra and Agamemnon -- that occur in both Out of the Past and Lady from Shanghai. And third, of somewhat greater moment than those two, there is regrettably no effort to engage with reflections on philosophy in film by analytic philosophers of film, such as Berys Gaut, Murray Smith, Paisley Livingston, and George Wilson, despite a lone appreciative footnote to the latter's groundbreaking Narration in Light.

I want to end this review on a positive note, which Pippin's engaging book clearly deserves. Fatalism in American Film Noir is a very welcome addition to the small but growing literature on philosophy in film, offering a highly literate, searching, and urbane traversal of three outstanding films from that genre, intelligently interrogated for their bearing on philosophical questions about the nature of the self, action, responsibility, and fate. It is testimony to the book's appeal that it is almost as absorbing as the dark cinematic dramas it sets out to elucidate, and at least as thought-provoking.