Fear of Knowledge: Against Relativism and Constructivism

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Paul Boghossian, Fear of Knowledge: Against Relativism and Constructivism, Oxford University Press, 2006, 152pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 019928718X.

Reviewed by Harvey Siegel, University of Miami


Fear of Knowledge starts out as an engaging, breezy critique of relativism and constructivism. Initial appearances prove deceptive; while Boghossian's discussion remains engaging, it quickly moves to a very high level of careful and rigorous argumentation, and stays at that level throughout. Focusing to a considerable extent on the work of Richard Rorty, Boghossian carefully articulates the target relativist and constructivist views and the arguments for and against them, on the way to equally careful statements of the views (and the arguments for them) that he favors. The book offers a sustained critique of a particular, postmodern-flavored, Rorty-inspired version of relativism/constructivism. That critique is powerful and on the whole highly effective. But the focus on Rorty, and Boghossian's intention to write a short, uncluttered and accessible book -- both of which are sensible and well-motivated -- lead the discussion away from consideration of highly relevant literature. The relative neglect of that literature (and the occasionally questionable treatment of it when addressed) makes the book somewhat less helpful to specialists than it will be to those seeking an effective antidote to Rortian postmodernist relativism. Moreover, the sophistication and complexity of Boghossian's discussion threatens to make it less accessible to the non-specialist than one might hope.

In Chapter 1 Boghossian begins laying out the target views, lamenting their wide embrace in the contemporary postmodern intellectual climate: "In vast stretches of the humanities and social sciences, this sort of 'postmodernist relativism' about knowledge has achieved the status of orthodoxy." (2) Boghossian characterizes such relativism in terms of the doctrine of

Equal Validity: There are many radically different, yet "equally valid" ways of knowing the world, with science being just one of them. (2)

Equal Validity seems "radical and counterintuitive" because it denies fact-objectivity: the idea that with respect to factual questions, "there is a way things are that is independent of us and our beliefs about it." (3) We ordinarily privilege and defer to the "variety of techniques and methods -- observation, logic, inference to the best explanation and so forth, but not tea-leaf reading or crystal ball gazing -- that we take to be the only legitimate ways of forming rational beliefs on the subject." (4) These techniques and methods characterize both science and "ordinary modes of knowledge-seeking." (4) Our privileging beliefs so formed in matters of enormous social moment -- e.g., in education, law, and the formulation of social policy -- means that Equal Validity is of more than merely epistemological significance: "If the vast numbers of scholars in the humanities and social sciences who subscribe to it are right, we are not merely making a philosophical mistake of interest to a small number of specialists in the theory of knowledge; we have fundamentally misconceived the principles by which society ought to be organized." (5)

Why do so many scholars subscribe to Equal Validity? Boghossian's explanation involves both ideological (the post-colonial rejection of colonialism, in general but especially in the name of spreading knowledge) and intellectual elements. The latter involve the rejection of objectivist conceptions of truth and rationality, and the embrace of a "social dependence conception of knowledge," according to which "the truth of a belief is not a matter of how things stand with an 'independently existing reality;' and its rationality is not a matter of its approval by 'transcendent procedures of rational assessment'." (6, emphasis in original, internal citations from Kathleen Lennon) The positive articulation of this latter conception of knowledge involves the idea of social construction.

Such social constructivist conceptions of knowledge are addressed in Chapter 2. Boghossian contrasts them with what he calls "The Classical Picture of Knowledge," according to which (1) "The world which we seek to understand and know about is what it is largely independently of us and our beliefs about it" ("Objectivism about Facts"), (2) "Facts of the Form -- information E justifies belief B -- are society-independent facts" ("Objectivism about Justification"), and (3) "Under the appropriate circumstances, our exposure to the evidence alone is capable of explaining why we believe what we believe" ("Objectivism about Rational Explanation"). (22)

Constructivist conceptions of knowledge dispute one or more of these aspects of the Classical Picture, and offer alternative accounts of them as follows: (1*) "The world which we seek to understand and know about is not what it is independently of us and our social context; rather, all facts are socially constructed in a way that reflects our contingent needs and interests" ("Constructivism about Facts"), (2*) "Facts of the form -- information E justifies belief B -- are not what they are independently of us and our social context; rather, all such facts are constructed in a way that reflects our contingent needs and interests" ("Constructivism about Justification"), and (3*) "It is never possible to explain why we believe what we believe solely on the basis of our exposure to the relevant evidence; our contingent needs and interests must also be invoked" ("Constructivism about Rational Explanation"). (22-3) Boghossian suggests that the truth of any one of these constructivist theses would render Equal Validity plausible (7, 23). They are the subjects of the rest of the chapters.

Chapters 3 and 4 address fact-constructivism. After pointing out the radical counter-intuitiveness of the doctrine (exemplified by Bruno Latour's denial that anyone could have died of tuberculosis before Koch discovered the bacillus in 1882 (26)), Boghossian turns in Chapter 3 to the accounts of fact-constructivism developed by Rorty, Nelson Goodman and Hilary Putnam, according to which "we construct a fact by accepting a way of talking or thinking which describes that fact." (27) Central to the view is the doctrine of the

Description Dependence of Facts: Necessarily, all facts are description-dependent: there cannot be a fact of the matter as to how things are with the world independently of our propensity to describe the world as being a certain way. Once we adopt a particular scheme for describing the world, there then come to be facts about the world. (28, emphasis in original)

While granting that some facts (e.g., facts about money, priests and presidents) are mind- and description-dependent in this way, Boghossian presses the counter-intuitiveness of the view that all facts are necessarily so dependent. He distinguishes fact-constructivism from another, weaker thesis with which it is, according to Boghossian, often conflated:

Social Relativity of Descriptions: Which scheme we adopt to describe the world will depend on which scheme we find it useful to adopt; and which scheme we find it useful to adopt will depend on our contingent needs and interests as social beings. (29, emphasis in original)

Boghossian neatly demonstrates Rorty's conflation of these two, and argues compellingly that the latter, contrary to Rorty, offers no support either to description-dependence in particular or fact-constructivism more generally. (27-32) Boghossian turns next to arguments for description-dependence put forward by Goodman and Putnam. Goodman's argument, Boghossian argues, illicitly generalizes from the description-dependence of particular, genuinely description-dependent facts, e.g., the fact that a particular configuration of stars is picked out by us as constituting the Big Dipper, to the description-dependence or fact-constructivism of all facts. More devastatingly, he argues that Goodman's characterization of description-dependence requires that "some facts not be description-dependent." (34, emphasis in original) He offers a similar critique of Putnam's well-known 'Polish logician' case. The basic criticism is that for description-dependence to work as Goodman and Putnam claim, there must be "some basic facts -- the basic worldly dough -- on which our redescriptive strategies can get to work. But that is precisely what fact-constructivism denies." (37-8) Boghossian's arguments here are exceedingly clear and forceful. But it should be noted that they have been familiar in the literature for some time; it is unfortunate that he discusses neither the highly similar arguments penned by others nor Goodman's and Putnam's responses to them.

Chapter 4 is devoted to Rorty's particular version of fact-constructivism which, according to Boghossian, "is tailor-made to get around the three problems we have just raised for constructivism" (41): the problem of causation (how can our descriptions cause the existence of things like mountains, whose existence seems to antedate ours?); the problem of conceptual competence (how can we coherently hold that the existence of things like electrons is dependent on our descriptions, given that part of the concept of electrons is that their existence is independent of us?); and the problem of disagreement (given the contingent nature of our social needs, interests and activities, how can fact-constructivism avoid violating the Law of Non-Contradiction ("How could it be the case both that the world is flat (the fact constructed by pre-Aristotelian Greeks) and that it is round (the fact constructed by us)?"). (40, emphasis in original) Rorty's fact-constructivism attempts to get around these problems by going relativistic: all talk of facts and 'the way the world is' must be understood as relative to a theory, language-game, way of talking, or the like. On this view, facts like 'electrons exist and have negative charges' and 'giraffes have long necks' are facts only relative to our language/way of talking, which are in turn shaped by our contingent needs, interests and activities; there are no facts independent of our descriptions.

This view helps resolve the three problems just mentioned, Boghossian claims, because it doesn't rely on there being any 'basic worldly dough' -- i.e., any way the world is in itself, independently of our descriptions -- and so on a distinction between it and our contingent ways of carving it up. (44-7) Indeed, Boghossian suggests that such relativization is the only way to solve these problems: "If fact-constructivism is to work at all, then, it looks as though it has to assume this relativistic Rortian form." (47, emphasis in original) But Boghossian argues that Rortian relativism is untenable. According to this untenable view, "Global Relativism about Facts,"

(i) There are no absolute facts of the form, p.

(ii) If our factual judgments are to have any prospect of being true, we must not construe utterances of the form "p" as expressing the claim p but rather as expressing the claim According to a theory, T, that we accept, p.

(iii) There are many alternative theories for describing the world, but no facts by virtue of which one is more faithful to the way things are in and of themselves than any of the others. (52, renumbered, italics in original)

Why is this view untenable? Boghossian considers "the traditional argument" (52) according to which it is untenable because incoherent, and finds that argument wanting; he offers another argument in its place. Let us look at these in turn.

According to Boghossian, the traditional argument concludes that the kind of relativism here addressed (i.e., 'global relativism about facts') is incoherent because "any relativistic thesis needs to commit itself to there being at least some absolute truths; yet what a global relativism asserts is that there are no absolute truths." (53, emphases in original) Notice here the shift, not discussed, from relativism about facts to relativism about truths. Boghossian quotes a version of the argument given by Thomas Nagel (which is actually an argument attempting to show that subjectivism is incoherent), according to which (making the substitutions of 'absolute' for 'objective' and 'relative' for 'subjective') the relativist's assertions (that 'there are no absolute facts of the form, p' for the Global Relativist about Facts, or 'there are no absolute truths or absolute standards of justification' for the traditional epistemological relativist) are caught on the horns of a dilemma: either they are offered as absolute truths, in which case the relativist, in offering them, contravenes her relativism; or they are offered as relative truths, in which case they fail to challenge the absolutism they are meant to deny. Either way, according to the traditional argument, the case for relativism fails. Boghossian reports that he "agree[s] with this traditional objection -- though I do not agree with the traditional argument by which it is defended." (53) He rejects the traditional argument because "it is not clear that it follows from the concession that relativism is itself to be true only relative to a theory, that it is just a report of what the relativist 'finds it agreeable to say.' Perhaps relativism is true relative to a theory that it pays for us all to accept, relativists and non-relativists alike." (54, internal citation from Nagel)

This criticism of the traditional argument fails, I think, for two reasons. First, we can and should ask of the key claim -- that it is possible that "relativism is true relative to a theory that it pays for us all to accept" -- whether it is true, or asserted by the critic to be true, relatively or absolutely. Here the dilemma re-arises, seemingly with full force. Either the critic is asserting as an absolute truth that this is possible, in which case her relativism is contravened; or she is asserting it as a relative truth ('According to theory T, that I accept, it is possible that relativism is true relative to a theory that it pays for us all to accept'), in which case it fails to seriously challenge the absolutism it is meant to contest, and the absolutist remains free to ignore it. Second, as already noted, the criticism slides back and forth between relativism about facts and relativism about truth. This conflation (or identification) is I think unfortunate; it is in any case more controversial than Boghossian acknowledges. (It is worth pointing out that Nagel's argument concerns the alleged relativity of reason and of judgment, not facts (The Last Word, 13-15).) Indeed, the traditional argument (offered by Plato in response to Protagorean relativism) is not aimed at relativism about facts, but rather relativism about truth and/or rational justification. In this respect, it might with some justice be said that Boghossian's treatment of the traditional argument is out of place here, since the view under consideration concerns the relativity of facts rather than the more usual epistemological targets.[1]

Boghossian's new argument for relativism's incoherence goes as follows: The relativist denies that there are facts of the form 'There have been dinosaurs,' but accepts that there could be facts of the form 'According to a theory that we accept, there have been dinosaurs.' Are facts of the latter form themselves absolute, according to the relativist? If the relativist answers 'yes,' he faces three problems: "First, and most decisively, he would be abandoning any hope of expressing the view he wanted to express, namely that there are no absolute facts of any kind, but only relative facts. Instead, he would end up expressing the view that the only absolute facts there are, are facts about what theories different communities accept." (54) In doing so he contravenes his relativism by acknowledging the existence of absolute facts, namely those concerning our beliefs, and "this would no longer be a global relativism." (55) Second, it is a "peculiar view in its own right," because "it's hard to believe that there is a difficulty about absolute facts concerning mountains and giraffes, but none concerning what beliefs people have. This seems to get things exactly the wrong way round." (55) Third, answering 'yes' seems to go against the thought that typically motivates the relativist, since "[h]is initial thought… is that there is something incoherent about the very possibility of an absolute fact, whether this concerns physical facts or mental facts or normative facts." (55) These three difficulties seem to me to provide quite compelling reasons for rejecting the version of relativism that flows from the 'yes' answer to Boghossian's question, but the first seems to be at most a minor variant of the problem with relativism noted by the traditional argument, the second to be relevant at best to a metaphysical relativism concerning the relative stability or fundamentality of physical vs. mental facts, and the third to address the coherence of an 'absolute' conception of facts rather than the notion of absolute truth that the traditional relativist seeks to call into question. That is, the first reason offers but a variant of the traditional objection to epistemological relativism, while the second and third reasons address worthy but different targets.

If the 'yes' answer is untenable, what of the 'no' answer? Boghossian argues that it leads to an infinite regress, according to which the relativist who answers his question in the negative "is committed to the view that the only facts there are, are infinitary facts of the form:

According to a theory that we accept, there is a theory that we accept and according to this latter theory, there is a theory that we accept and… there have been dinosaurs.

But it is absurd to propose that, in order for our utterances to have any prospect of being true, what we must mean by them are infinitary propositions that we could neither express nor understand." (56) This does indeed seem absurd.

Boghossian concludes that "The real dilemma facing the global relativist, then, is this: either the formulation that he offers us does not succeed in expressing the view that there are only relative facts; or it consists in the claim that we should so reinterpret our utterances that they express infinitary propositions that we can neither express nor understand." (56) The newness of the argument is highlighted by its leading to this dilemma rather than the more familiar one raised by the traditional argument concerning the relative or absolute status of the relativist's claim that truth (and/or justification) is relative.

Boghossian's new argument against the coherence of relativism succeeds, I am happy to grant, as an argument against the Rorty-inspired "Global Relativism about Facts" (which itself "harks back to Protagoras," according to Boghossian (47)) that Boghossian formulates and is in this chapter most concerned to address. It is clearly a different argument than the traditional one, and is aimed at a different sort of relativism (concerning facts) than the sort of epistemological relativism captured by Protagoras' 'homo mensura' ('man is the measure') and challenged by philosophers from Plato to Nagel. And it should be noted that Rorty has taken considerable pains to distance himself from the latter sort of relativism -- a fact that Boghossian never mentions.[2] Aimed at the Protagorean view concerning truth and/or rational justification (at which the traditional objection is aimed), the new argument is in considerable part misdirected. Addressed to Rortian global relativism about facts, that argument is powerful, but it is important to realize both that the Plato/Nagel-type anti-relativist arguments that Boghossian's new argument is meant to replace are directed at a rather different target, and that his own diagnosis of the success of the new argument -- that it shows that "[o]ur grip on [global] relativistic views derives from our grip on local relativisms… [which] explicitly commit themselves to the existence of absolute truths" (56) -- is very much in line with the traditional objection that the epistemological relativist cannot defend her view except by presupposing and relying on the very sort of absolute truth that her relativism is meant to reject.[3] Boghossian's discussion is hampered by its failure to address the complexities just noted concerning the targets of the various anti-relativist arguments and the similarities and differences among those arguments.

Chapters 5, 6 and 7 turn away from fact-constructivism to address justification-constructivism. In Hegelian fashion, Boghossian offers a putatively strong argument for epistemic relativism in chapter 5, a putatively strong argument against it in chapter 6, and a resolution of this 'paradox' in chapter 7.

Chapter 5 ("Epistemic Relativism Defended") begins with a brief explication of the Galileo/Bellarmine dispute, and uses this case as a running example in discussing Rorty's "constructivist/relativist view of justified belief," according to which "there are no absolute facts about what justifies what"; rather, there are "fundamentally different epistemic systems -- fundamentally different 'grids' for determining 'what sorts of evidence there could be for statements about the movements of planets.' And there is no fact of the matter as to which of their systems is 'correct'." (62, emphasis in original, internal citations from Rorty) Rather, as with the Rortian view of facts, on the Rortian view of justification the latter is relative to such systems and ways of talking about evidence and justification, and there is no non-question-begging way to establish the 'absolute' strengths/weaknesses of such systems: "If our judgments about what it's 'rational' to believe are to have any prospect of being true, we should not claim that some belief (e.g. Copernicanism) is justified absolutely by the available evidence (e.g. Galileo's observations), but only that it is justified relative to the particular epistemic system that we have come to accept." (62-3) Since there is no fact of the matter concerning the correctness/incorrectness of such epistemic systems, we should be relativists about justification. And we should notice that this view of justification gives considerable comfort to advocates of Equal Validity.

Boghossian approaches the view, and what "appears to be a seductively powerful argument in its support" (63), by considering our ("post-Galilean") epistemic system. That system operates according to principles of justified-belief generation and transmission such as Observation ("For any observational proposition p, if it visually seems to S that p and circumstantial conditions D obtain, then S is prima facie justified in believing p" (64)); Deduction ("If S is justified in believing p and p fairly obviously entails q, then S is justified in believing q" (66)); and Induction ("If S has often enough observed that an event of type A has been followed by an event of type B, then S is justified in believing that all events of type A will be followed by events of type B" (67)). These principles are not meant to be precisely formulated, and they are not claimed to be explicitly embraced; rather, they are "implicit in our practice, rather than explicit in our formulations." (65, emphasis in original) Together, these three "specify a significant portion, even if not the whole, of the fundamental principles of our ordinary, 'post-Galilean' epistemic system. (The way of fixing beliefs that we call 'science' is in large part a rigorous application of these ordinary, familiar principles.) By a 'fundamental' principle, I mean a principle whose correctness cannot be derived from the correctness of other epistemic principles." (67, emphasis in original) Such fundamental principles "can be justified, if at all, only by appeal to themselves." For example, "Any evidence in support of Observation, it would seem, would have to rely on Observation itself." (68)

This is enough "to engage the relativist's claim that there are no absolute facts about what justifies what, but only relational facts about what is allowed or forbidden by particular epistemic systems." (68-9) In our post-Galilean epistemic system Observation, Deduction and Induction are fundamental principles; in Bellarmine's system Revelation ("For certain propositions p, including propositions about the heavens, believing p is prima facie justified if p is the revealed word of God as claimed by the Bible" (69)) is presumably such a principle, and in the Azande system a principle like Oracle ("For certain propositions p, believing p is prima facie justified if a Poison Oracle says that p" (71)) is presumably equally fundamental. Rorty (along with Wittgenstein (69-80)) defends this sort of relativism concerning justification on the basis of "the fact that there is no system-independent fact in virtue of which one epistemic system could be said to be more correct than any other." (69)

The apparently "seductively powerful argument" in support of epistemic relativism can now be stated. First, assume that our epistemic system is fundamentally different than the systems of Bellarmine and the Azande, in the sense that "their underived epistemic principles diverge from ours." (72) Assume as well that these systems are genuine alternatives in that "on a given range of propositions and fixed evidential circumstances, they yield conflicting verdicts on what it is justified to believe." (73, emphasis in original) Now formulate epistemic relativism using "the template we developed in the previous chapter":

Epistemic Relativism:

A. There are no absolute facts about what belief a particular item of information justifies. (Epistemic non-absolutism)

B. If a person, S's, epistemic judgments are to have any prospect of being true, we must not construe his utterances of the form "E justifies belief B" as expressing the claim E justifies belief B but rather as expressing the claim: According to the epistemic system C, that I, S, accept, information E justifies belief B. (Epistemic relationism)

C. There are many fundamentally different, genuinely alternative epistemic systems, but no facts by virtue of which one of these systems is more correct than any of the others. (Epistemic pluralism) (73, italics in original)

The "very strong prima facie case" (73) for epistemic relativism so formulated is this:

Argument for Epistemic Relativism

1. If there are absolute epistemic facts about what justifies what, then it ought to be possible to arrive at justified beliefs about them.

2. It is not possible to arrive at justified beliefs about what absolute epistemic facts there are. Therefore,

3. There are no absolute epistemic facts. (Epistemic non-absolutism)

4. If there are no absolute epistemic facts, then epistemic relativism is true. Therefore,

5. Epistemic relativism is true. (74)


Boghossian grants for the sake of discussion premise 4, thus resting the case for epistemic relativism on the case for epistemic non-absolutism (A. in the statement of Epistemic Relativism, and 3. in the argument for it), and takes up the two premises from which, according to the seductively powerful argument, that conclusion is alleged to follow. Boghossian briefly defends Premise 1 (75-6), but attends mainly to Premise 2. How, for example, might we show that Bellarmine is incorrect when he denies that Galileo's observations justify Copernicanism? Showing that this follows from our fundamental epistemic principles will cut no ice, since Bellarmine will reject some sub-set of those principles, advancing one we reject (Revelation) in its place that we in turn reject. The dispute is ultimately one concerning alternative epistemic systems and their respective fundamental principles. Could it be shown that any such principle is justified? As Boghossian puts it, "To show… that our system is correct and theirs wrong, we would have to justify the principles of our system over theirs, we would have to offer them some argument that demonstrated the objective superiority of our system over theirs. But any such argument would require using an epistemic system, relying on the cogency of some epistemic principles and not others." (77, emphases in original) Since we think our system is correct, we would of course use it, and Bellarmine would for the same reason use his. While it is not inevitable, it is "very likely" that each system of principles would "decide in favor of themselves and against the other practice." (77) In this case, "we will have two self-supporting practices that are at odds with each other. Will we have shown anything substantive; could we really claim to have demonstrated that our principles are correct, and theirs not? Is either one of us in a position to call the other 'wrong'?" (77) If not, Premise 2 seems to have been established, and

with that the relativist's argument goes through. The most that any epistemic practice will be able to say, when confronted by a fundamentally different, genuine alternative, self-supporting epistemic practice, is that it is correct by its own lights, whereas the alternative isn't. But that cannot yield a justification of the one practice over the other, without begging the question. If the point is to decide which of the two practices is better than the other, self-certification is not going to help. Each side will be able to provide a norm-circular justification of its own practice; neither side will be able to provide anything more. With what right, then, could either party claim to have a superior conception of rational or justified belief? (79-80, emphases in original)

It is important to remember that Boghossian is not actually advancing this 'seductively powerful argument'; rather, it is the thesis that is to be followed by its antithesis (in Chapter 6) and a synthesis or 'resolution of the paradox' (in Chapter 7). So I won't detail at any length here my reasons for finding the argument less seductively powerful than a sympathetic reader should. Very briefly: the seductively powerful argument and the case for it just cited seems to presuppose that (a) rival epistemic systems are distinct wholes, without significant overlap; (b) such systems share no common presuppositions that can be appealed to in arguments concerning system-superiority; (c) the question concerning their relative merits can be posed by the relativist without self-contradiction -- that is, that the posing of the question does not itself presuppose 'absolutism'; and (d) norm-circular justification, or self-justifying claims or principles, cannot succeed in establishing the justificatory status of epistemic principles. All these presuppositions have been challenged in the literature. One must also wonder from what epistemic system this argument for epistemic relativism is made: doesn't the mere fact that it must be made from some system or other render the argument, when applied reflexively to itself, problematic? Boghossian acknowledges that he is here "deliberately eliding certain important distinctions" (79) that he addresses in subsequent chapters. So I will defer discussion of these several points for the moment, as we follow Boghossian on his Hegelian path.

Chapter 6 ("Epistemic Relativism Rejected") begins by taking up the matter of norm-circularity. It begins with Nagel's defense of the norm-circular defense of reason against challenges to it on the grounds that such challenges presuppose reason's legitimacy by demanding reasons for/against it, so that "the appeal to reason is implicitly authorized by the challenge itself." (81, citing The Last Word, 24)[4] Boghossian concedes that Nagel's defense works against the skeptic who challenges reason itself, but denies that this helps against Rorty's relativist, because the problem of norm-circularity "is not in the first instance a challenge to reason itself, but a challenge to the objective validity of specific forms of reasoning." (82) Neither Galileo nor Bellarmine (nor the tea-leaf reader (81-2)) skeptically challenge reason itself; they rather challenge each other's fundamental epistemic principles, and seemingly cannot defend their own as objectively superior to their opponents' principles, since both they and their opponents can defend their principles only norm-circularly.

Boghossian is rather too easy on Rorty here, I think. The question facing the Rortian epistemic relativist is whether his own 'at best norm-circular' argument is in any way objectively superior, epistemically, to the absolutist argument of his opponent. Here it seems that the standard Platonic objection to relativism applies with full force. Rorty's argument concludes that no fundamental epistemic principle is objectively better/worse than any other, because such principles can be justified at most norm-circularly, and norm-circular justification cannot establish objective epistemic merit. Does this argument itself depend upon any such principles? If yes, since they themselves can be justified only norm-circularly, that conclusion seems itself to be established not objectively, but only relatively to those principles, in which case there is no reason for Rorty's opponent to embrace them; if no, then this relativism is contravened. It is not at the level of the Galileo/Bellarmine dispute, but rather at the meta-level at which Rorty's argument against norm-circular justification is reflexively applied to itself, that the traditional objection bites. But we needn't linger here, because while Boghossian holds that "[t]he problem posed by norm-circularity for the epistemic objectivist" is not successfully addressed by Nagel's argument, he "[n]evertheless… agree[s] with Nagel that epistemic relativism is not a tenable view. What is wrong with it?" (82)

Boghossian considers the "traditional refutation" considered earlier, reformulated to address relativism concerning epistemic justification. (82-4) As earlier, he finds fault with "the subjectivist horn" of the dilemma posed by the refutation. As earlier, I think Boghossian's reply on behalf of the relativist does not succeed. The refutation offered by the 'objectivist' (as Boghossian labels the relativist's opponent) has a better formulation than the one Boghossian gives it: namely, that if the relativist is taking issue with the objectivist/absolutist, and offering and defending a position which he takes to be superior to his opponent's position, which defense ought rationally to persuade his opponent, he has given up his relativism; while if not, he fails to challenge (as opposed to disagree with) that opponent's position. In any case, Boghossian zeroes in on two assumptions of the Rortian pro-relativist argument: that "in evaluating an epistemic system there is no alternative but to use some epistemic system or other," and that "there is no interesting notion of justification that will allow us to justify a form of reasoning through the use of that very form of reasoning." (83) These prove to be enough for Boghossian to formulate his own anti-relativist argument.

Consider an example of a particular, unrelativized epistemic judgment:

1. Copernicanism is justified by Galileo's observations. (84)

According to the relativist, we should replace all such judgments with relativized versions, e.g.:

2. Copernicanism is justified by Galileo's observations relative to a system, Science, that I, the speaker, accept. (85)

Remember that epistemic systems consist of sets of "general normative propositions -- epistemic principles -- which specify under which conditions a particular type of belief is justified." (85) While a particular epistemic judgment would say something like

3. If it visually seems to Galileo that there are mountains on the moon, then Galileo is justified in believing that there are mountains on the moon (85),

an epistemic principle will be more general, e.g.,

(Observation) For any observational proposition p, if it visually seems to S that p and circumstantial conditions D obtain, then S is prima facie justified in believing p. (85)

Thus we see that "the epistemic principles which constitute particular epistemic systems are just more general versions of particular epistemic judgments. They, too, are propositions stating the conditions under which a belief would be absolutely justified." (85) And this puts Boghossian in position to formulate his own anti-relativist argument:

… if the relativist's central thought is that particular epistemic judgments are uniformly false, and so must be replaced by judgments about what is entailed by the epistemic systems that we happen to accept, then it follows from this central thought that the general epistemic principles which constitute the epistemic systems that we accept must be false, too, for they are general propositions of much the same type… . [But] it is crucial to the relativist's view that thinkers accept one or another of these systems, that they endorse one or another of them and then talk about what they do and do not permit… . But how could we go on accepting one or another of these epistemic systems, once we have bought in on the relativist's central thought that there are no absolute facts about justification… ? The relativist says that we should stop making absolute judgments about what justifies what and that we should stick to saying what epistemic judgments follow from the epistemic systems we accept… . But it is hard to see how we might coherently follow this advice. Given that the propositions which make up epistemic systems are just very general propositions about what absolutely justifies what, it makes no sense to insist that we abandon making absolute particular judgments about what justifies what while allowing us to accept absolute general judgments about what justifies what. But that is, in effect, what the epistemic relativist is recommending… . It is also hard to explain why anyone should care about what follows from a set of propositions that are acknowledged to be uniformly false… .Epistemic relativism looks to be an incoherent response to the putative discovery that there are no absolute facts about epistemic justification. (85-7, emphases in original)

I should note, first, that this characterization of epistemic relativism does not capture the traditional, Protagoras-inspired character of the view, according to which 'particular epistemic judgments' are not 'uniformly false,' but rather relatively true/false (and/or justified/unjustified). Does it capture Rorty's version? On this point I defer to Boghossian and other Rorty scholars. But as Boghossian has characterized it, it appears that the Rortian epistemic relativist does not allow us "to accept absolute general judgments about what justifies what." Rather, Rorty's relativist insists that we relativize such judgments to epistemic systems. The Rortian relativist accepts the deliverances of her own epistemic system, but at the same time fully recognizes that those deliverances enjoy no higher epistemic status than the deliverances of alternative systems. She doesn't take them to enjoy any sort of absolutist justificatory status; she realizes that her acceptance of them is arbitrary in the sense that they flow from a system which itself cannot be non-question-beggingly defended. Consequently, 'accept' is a misleading term to use to characterize the view: as such a relativist, Rorty himself accepts the judgments that flow from his epistemic system, but he recognizes that they are no more justified, absolutely, than the incompatible judgments that flow from alternative systems. And if he is consistent, he recognizes that that very recognition is likewise no more justified, absolutely, than those that flow from alternative systems. And this seems to make him vulnerable to the traditional objection that the relativist is incapable of defending her own view without giving it up.

Boghossian further criticizes the Epistemic Pluralism clause of the Rorty-inspired version of epistemic relativism. (89-91) His criticisms here seem to me exactly right, but they are very like the critical arguments aimed at the traditional, Protagoras-inspired version. (Ignored here are the extensive discussions of the notion of relative truth to which relativists sometimes turn in attempts to parry these criticisms.) He also effectively highlights difficulties befalling efforts to avoid all these problems facing the relativist by taking epistemic systems to be sets of imperatives. (91-3)

In Chapter 7 ("The Paradox Resolved") Boghossian addresses the 'paradox' constituted by the "seemingly compelling argument, based on the inevitable norm-circularity of justifications of our epistemic systems, for a form of relativism about epistemic judgments" in Chapter 5, coupled with our having seen in Chapter 6 "that such a relativism is riddled with seemingly insuperable problems." (95) His strategy is to argue that the "seemingly compelling argument" of Chapter 5 is in fact not compelling, and that, in particular, "the argument from norm-circularity should not be credited with supporting epistemic relativism (more precisely, why it should not be seen as supporting epistemic non-absolutism)" (95) after all.

His challenge to that argument takes the form of criticism of one of its premises, here named Justification: "It is not possible to arrive at justified beliefs about what absolute epistemic facts there are." (96) Boghossian argues that, contrary to Justification, we can have justified beliefs about some absolute epistemic facts. Consider epistemic principles which give inconsistent advice, e.g., "If it visually seems to S as though there is a dog in front of him, then it is justified for S to believe that there is a dog in front of him and not justified for S to believe that there is a dog in front of him." (97) Boghossian says of this example: "This is obviously an extreme example of an objectively flawed epistemic principle, but it serves to make the important point that we cannot ultimately make sense of the crucial pluralist claim that there are no facts whatsoever which discriminate between all the possible epistemic systems out there." (97)[5] This example of an incoherent principle suggests that there are indeed constraints, for example coherence, which epistemic systems must meet.

Supposing that the existence of such constraints is acknowledged by all parties to the debate, how does one get from this point to the possibility of justified belief concerning absolute epistemic facts? Boghossian's route travels through 'blind entitlement': "each thinker is blindly entitled to his own epistemic system -- each thinker is entitled to use the epistemic system he finds himself with, without first having to supply an antecedent justification for the claim that it is the correct system." (99, emphasis in original) This step on Boghossian's route is problematic, I think. (I acknowledge, but cannot address here, the deep issues concerning entitlement that lurk.) Such entitlement, if it indeed obtains, is clearly distinct from epistemic justification, since it is clearly possible for a thinker to be 'blindly entitled to use the system he finds himself with,' even though that system fails to meet (for example) the demands of coherence, just noted, that Boghossian accepts as constraining epistemic systems and principles. Our entitlement to rely upon our own, antecedently unjustified epistemic principles in contemplating the justificatory status of putative epistemic facts -- if we are so entitled -- does not entail either that we are justified in relying on them, or that they are themselves justified. On the other hand, if it is stipulated that entitlement entails justification, it is not clear that we are in that sense 'entitled to our own epistemic systems,' since, as Boghossian argues, some such systems fail to satisfy epistemic constraints such as coherence, and for that reason fail to be justified.

Whether or not I am right about that, I think that Boghossian's more general argument against Justification -- that norm-circularity is not problematic in general, but only in the special case in which an offered norm-circular justification is of a principle whose correctness "we have legitimately come to doubt" (100, emphasis in original) -- is plausible (although it would be good to know whether this 'legitimacy' is itself relative to an epistemic system). But there is a more direct response to the allegedly problematic status of norm-circularity that seems to me more effective in rebutting Justification. It begins by noticing that norm-circular justifications are not all alike. Consider Revelation: when Galileo challenges it, and Bellarmine responds by claiming that its justificatory status itself depends upon the principle's being revealed, Galileo seems well within his rights when he charges Bellarmine with begging the question by presupposing the legitimacy of the very principle being challenged. Now consider another principle, Reason, according to which epistemic principles are justified to the extent that they enjoy adequate support from objectively good reasons. (I immediately grant that Reason needs to be stated far more carefully to be taken seriously as a candidate fundamental epistemic principle.) There is a striking difference between Revelation and Reason: while Galileo can challenge the former without presupposing it, it appears that the latter cannot be challenged in that way. Challenging Reason (like challenging any other putative principle) amounts to claiming that there is no good non-question-begging reason to accept it. This challenge stands or falls on the identification of such good, non-question-begging reasons -- which is to say that the challenger presupposes, in the very offering of the challenge, that it is possible in principle for such reasons to be identified, and further, that if they were to be forthcoming, the challenge would be met and defeated. That is, the challenger is committed, in launching the challenge, to the challenged principle. Such a principle -- indeed, the possibility of such a principle -- stands as a direct counter-example to Justification.

Boghossian can respond, as above, that while this defense of Reason works against the skeptic who challenges reason itself, it fails to constitute a general response to the problem of norm-circularity, because that problem "is not in the first instance a challenge to reason itself, but a challenge to the objective validity of specific forms of reasoning." (82) He may well be right about this, if he can establish that Reason is in fact not a principle governing "specific forms of reasoning." Nevertheless, it seems clear (and Boghossian may well accept) that this kind of norm-circularity -- i.e., a norm-circular defense of a principle that cannot be challenged without presupposing that very principle in the formulation and launch of the challenge -- is both unproblematic and epistemically significant. If a principle cannot be challenged except by presupposing it, it enjoys an enviable epistemic status. This sort of self-justification is central to the traditional, Protagoras-inspired debate concerning relativism. Here is a place where Boghossian's and the traditional absolutist's arguments are divergent but complementary.

Boghossian also effectively challenges the idea (labeled Encounter, and offered in several formulations) that if we encountered an actual, coherent, fundamental, genuine alternative to our own epistemic system, with a decent enough track record, we would not be able to justify ours over the encountered alternative (96-101), by pointing to the difficulty of actually finding such an alternative. He offers a very strong case for thinking that Bellarmine's system is not fundamentally different than ours after all, and that the Azande's system is likewise not a genuine alternative. (103-9) While his arguments here differ from Davidson's, Boghossian's conclusion is so strikingly similar to the one Davidson reached in his "On the Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme" that it is a shame he doesn't attempt to relate the two.

Boghossian's conclusion at the end of Chapter 7 is that "we have no option but to think that there are absolute, practice-independent facts about what beliefs it would be most reasonable to have under fixed evidential conditions." (110) Relativism having now been vanquished, he turns in Chapter 8 to address Constructivism about Rational Explanation, according to which it "is never possible to explain why we believe what we believe solely on the basis of our exposure to the relevant evidence: our contingent needs and interests must also be invoked." (111) It is important to Boghossian's project to defeat this sort of constructivism, because "it wouldn't matter very much" that the epistemic force of reasons "must be thought of as absolute" if this sort of constructivism were true, for if it were true it wouldn't be possible "for us to be moved to belief by our epistemic reasons," however absolute they might be. (111, emphases in original)

Boghossian's critique is effective, if brief. In a relatively few pages he dispatches the strong constructivism (according to which epistemic reasons make no contribution to the causal explanation of any of our beliefs) alleged to follow from the symmetry principles of "the sociology of scientific knowledge" (SSK) (112-18), and the weak constructivism (according to which epistemic reasons can make some contribution to such explanation, but contingent social needs and interests must also be invoked) flowing from Kuhnian (118-25) and Duhemian (125-8) underdetermination. Boghossian's arguments here, though brief, seem to me completely compelling. But it is disappointing that they are versions of arguments that have often been made in the literature, and that virtually no mention is made either of the many commentators who have made them (Shapere, Scheffler, Laudan, Toulmin, etc.), or of responses and nuanced revisions introduced by the criticized authors. For example, from Boghossian's discussion a reader would get no inkling of the fact that Kuhn spent the three+ decades after the initial publication of Structure addressing his critics, renouncing many of his earlier formulations, and developing his positive view in interesting and substantial ways.

His consistent ignoring of large swaths of relevant literature and arguments will make Boghossian's book frustrating to philosophers who work in this area. Equally frustrating are Boghossian's concentration on Rorty, and moreover his attention to only a relatively narrow (if admittedly central) portion of Rorty's work, ignoring other portions in which Rorty is careful to distance himself from certain forms of relativism. (I do not mean to be endorsing Rorty's view here, but only to suggest that it is more complex than Boghossian's discussion acknowledges.) Finally, Boghossian's discussions of the 'traditional' Protagorean and Platonic arguments concerning relativism, and the ways in which they relate (or not) to the Rortian relativism/constructivism that constitutes the central target of the text, are in the several ways noted above problematic.

On the other hand, the book does a fine job of assessing in brief compass the sort of relativism/constructivism advocated by Rorty and his fellow travelers, and Boghossian's sophisticated and careful arguments against that Rortian view are often ingenious and invariably telling. Aimed at non-specialists, Fear of Knowledge may well succeed in distancing those who are enamored of 'postmodern relativism' (and have both the ability and the inclination to follow Boghossian's sophisticated analyses and arguments) from their postmodern enthusiasms. And Boghossian has wise things to say concerning the contemporary split between 'academic philosophy,' which by and large rejects the target views, and the rest of the humanities and social sciences, which, unfortunately in Boghossian's view as in my own, are far more welcoming of them.[6]

[1] A problem I here note but do not address in detail concerns the place of truth in the panoply of relativistic views. Boghossian sharply distinguishes relativism about facts from relativism about justification. His discussion of the former includes truth, so that the view he here criticizes -- Rorty's relativistic fact-constructivism -- holds both that facts are constructed and that there are no absolute truths concerning such facts. This 'fact/truth' alignment differs from traditional, Protagoras-inspired discussions of relativism, in which truth is often understood as an epistemological rather than as a metaphysical notion, and in which truth is aligned not with facts but with justification. No doubt truth can reasonably be seen in both lights; I do not suggest that Boghossian's alignment is mistaken. But it does carve up the territory differently than Plato and subsequent commentators do, which perhaps explains why Boghossian thinks the traditional argument is meant to address fact-constructivism. Insofar as we adopt Boghossian's alignment, the traditional argument works just fine against fact-constructivism, since it applies to the truth status of claims concerning facts.

Here's a slightly different angle from which to see the difficulty with construing 'the traditional argument' as concerning facts rather than truths. Consider Protagoras' claim that "what seems true to anyone is true for him to whom it seems so." (Theaetetus, 170a) Suppose that it seems true to Smith that grass is green. Assume that truths are made true by facts that serve as truth-makers. On Plato's and Boghossian's view, the fact that makes Smith's belief (absolutely) true is the fact that grass is green. On Protagoras' view, the relative-truth-making fact is rather the fact that it seems to Smith that grass is green. On both views, the relevant claim is true ('absolutely' on the one view, 'relatively' on the other) because of a relevant fact that makes it so. But the respective views invoke different facts. Boghossian's interpretation of the traditional argument as aiming at constructed facts rather than truths obscures this.

[2]See my 'Relativism' (in Niiniluoto, Sintonen and Woleński, eds., Handbook of Epistemology (Dordrect: Kluwer, 2004, 747-780), 767), for references and brief discussion.

[3]As already suggested, Boghossian's failure to distinguish from among these different sorts of relativism and the various arguments for/against them, and failure to dip more deeply into the vast literatures on both, weakens his otherwise strong discussion. At the risk of incurring the charge of self-promotion, I recommend my own 'Relativism' (op. cit.) and Relativism Refuted: A Critique of Contemporary Epistemological Relativism (Dordrecht: Kluwer, 1987), which if nothing else offer extensive references to the relevant literature.

[4]Nagel argues that this presupposition renders the challenge to reason "unintelligible." (The Last Word, 24) In my view this is a mistake.  The presupposition shows not that the challenge is unintelligible, but rather that it contains within itself the seeds of its own resolution in reason's favor. For discussion, see my Rationality Redeemed?: Further Dialogues on an Educational Ideal (Routledge, 1997), chapter 5.

[5]It is unfortunate to put the point in terms of what we can/cannot "ultimately make sense of." Boghossian here makes sufficient sense of it to offer a counter-example, which shows (if he is right) not that "the crucial pluralist claim" cannot be made sense of, but rather that that claim is false.

[6]Thanks to John Biro, Ed Erwin, Colin McGinn, and especially Paul Boghossian for helpful comments and advice.