Fearless Speech

Placeholder book cover

Foucault, Michel, Fearless Speech, ed. Joseph Pearson, Semiotext(e), 2001, 183 pp, $11.95 (pbk), ISBN 1-58435-011-3.

Reviewed by Thomas R. Flynn, Emory University


Strictly speaking, this is not a book, just as Hegel’s monumental Lectures on Fine Art is not a book. In both cases we are dealing with lecture notes taken by students and not approved for publication by their respective authors. But if this leaves them “unofficial,” it in no way compromises their authenticity, at least not in Foucault’s case. For what goes by the title “Fearless Speech” (a free translation of parrhesia) consists of the transcribed recordings of lectures delivered by Foucault in a seminar at the University of California, Berkeley in the fall of 1983, the year before his death. A bibliography had been added and a certain amount of critical editing done to render a more useful and readable text.

These six lectures, given in English, constitute a vital bridge between his official lectures at the Collège de France the previous and the following semester, which would be his last. Despite Foucault’s apparent prohibition against “posthumous publications,” the annual course of public lectures for which he contracted at the Collège is being systematically edited and published. Three have appeared thus far: Il faut défendre la société (1976), Les Anormaux (1975) and L’Herméneutique du sujet (1982). The assumption is that these are already part of the public intellectual domain. Foucault never objected to his lectures being recorded. But scholars must respect the result as indicative of “work in progress” and not at all as Foucault’s definitive word on the matter at hand (if it had ever been his style to offer such).

If Foucault insists that truth has long been his interest, it is not the epistemological question that concerns him. In a remark from his Conclusion that serves as the epigram at the start of this volume, he states that his intention “was not to deal with the problem of truth, but with the problem of the truth-teller, or of truth-telling as an activity….” Truth is “a thing of this world,” he remarks elsewhere. On his analysis, it is closely linked to relations of power and the constitution of the subject. The topic of these lectures as of those of the following year is parrhesia, plain speaking, le franc parler. Though there is some overlap between the Berkeley lectures and those at the Collège, their accents are different. The former stresses parrhesia as a political virtue—you tell the Prince the truth even if it costs you your head—the latter emphasizes parrhesia as a moral virtue—you admit the truth to yourself even if it threatens your self-image.

The editor has divided the six lectures into four chapters and a Conclusion according to topics that reflect the progress of the argument but fail to coincide with the division of the lectures. The first of these chapters attends to the meaning and the evolution of the term “parrhesia.” Foucault characterizes parrhesia as “a verbal activity in which a speaker expresses his personal relationship to truth, and risks his life because he recognizes truth-telling as a duty to improve or help other people (as well as himself)” (19). He then proceeds to analyze the evolution of the “parrhesiastic game” in ancient culture from three points of view, the rhetorical, the political and the philosophical. It is this last that affords Foucault the most space for analysis in his lectures of the following year by associating philosophical parrhesia with care of the self (epimeleia heautou), a major theme in his lectures at the Collège since 1982. But that association is already elaborated in the final chapter of this book.

Chapter Two focuses on parrhesia in six tragedies of Euripidesf, especially the Ion, which he considers devoted entirely to parrhesia in a positive sense, and the Orestes, where the term is used both positively and negatively in the sense of ignorant outspokenness. Employing a term proper to his last works, Foucault notes that there was no “problematization” of parrhesia in the former play but that the term was undergoing a crisis in the latter. He speaks of a “crisis of the function” of the term in the Orestes: Who is entitled to use parrhesia? And what is its relation to knowledge and education? These, of course, are not just Euripidean problems; they are properly Foucauldian ones, especially when he adds that the requisite training for the parrhesiast in the Orestes was more likely neither Socratic nor Platonic but “the kind of experience that an autourgos [the farmer who works his own land] would get through his own life” (73).

Foucault concludes:

The crisis of parrhesia, which emerges at the crossroads of an interrogation about democracy and an interrogation about truth, gives rise to a problematization of some hitherto unproblematic relations between freedom, power, democracy, education, and truth in Athens at the end of the Fifth Century. From the previous problem of gaining access to parrhesia in spite of the silence of god [the difficulty of the Ion], we move to a problematization of parrhesia. (73)

He assures us he is not claiming that freedom of speech was a new idea for the Greeks of that period. Rather, he is appealing to a new way of relating education, freedom, power, and the existing political institutions to the way freedom of speech is understood in Athens. In other words, he is undertaking a “history of thought” rather than writing a “history of ideas.”

He concludes his third lecture and the second chapter by elaborating that distinction which has been a defining feature of his work since his major dissertation for the doctorat d’état in 1961. In contrast with the traditional history of ideas that tries to determine when a specific concept appears, locating it in the setting of other ideas which constitute its context, Foucault is trying “to analyze the way institutions, practices, habits, and behavior become a problem for people who behave in certain sorts of ways, who have certain types of habits, who engage in certain kinds of practices, and who put to work specific kinds of institutions” (74). This description relates the history of thought much more closely to “problematization” than when he first introduced the concept:

The history of thought is the analysis of the way an unproblematic field of experience or a set of practices, which were accepted without question, which were familiar and “silent,” out of discussion, becomes a problem, raises discussion and debate, incites new reactions, and induces a crisis in the previously silent behavior, habits, practices and institutions. (74)

Extending this to virtually the entirety of his work, he suggests as possible objects of such crises and their analysis: madness, crime, sex, oneself, and truth.

In the third chapter, Foucault addresses parrhesia and the crisis of democratic institutions in ancient Athens. Here the issue is whether democracy is considered compatible with positive parrhesia. The texts he cites argue that it is not. But he concludes from Plato’s Republic (Book VIII, 557a-b) and other works that “parrhesia is regarded more and more as a personal attitude, a personal quality, as a virtue which is useful for the city’s political life in the case of positive or critical parrhesia, or as a danger for the city in the case of negative, pejorative parrhesia.” (85) And it is increasingly linked to another kind of political institution, namely, monarchy. “Parrhesia is no longer an institutional right or privilege—as in a democratic city—but is much more a personal attitude, a choice of bios”(86). This trend is confirmed by Aristotle for whom the term denotes either a moral-ethical quality or the free speech addressed to a monarch. As the political situation changes so too does the use of “parrhesia.”

This admixture of the moral and the political ushers in the subject of the final chapter as well as the topic that Foucault will address in his last course at the Collège de France: Parrhesia and care of the self. “Care of the self,” of course, will be the title of the third volume of Foucault’s History of Sexuality to be published the following year. But it plays a central role in his earlier accounts of the relation between truth and subjectification in the genesis of the modern self. In his 1982 course at the Collège, for example, the year before his Berkeley seminar, we find him distinguishing care of the self from the Delphic injunction to “know thyself.” Whereas the latter came to be “epistemologized,” one might say, in the course of the professionalization of philosophy in later centuries (Foucault refers to the “Cartesian moment” in this regard), care of the self retained a “spiritual” dimension that one saw in the Stoics and which required a certain kind of asceticism as a condition for gaining access to “truth.”

What Foucault calls “Socratic parrhesia”, as distinct from the political parrhesia discussed thus far, exhibits this harmony between speech and life, logos and bios, that “care of the self” promotes. The challenge that faces Plato is to bring this Socratic harmony into tune with the political parrhesia involving logos, truth, and nomos (law). “How can philosophical truth and moral virtue relate to the city through the nomos?” (104). Plato will attempt this reconciliation in the Apology, the Crito, the Republic and the Laws. But the Cynics like Diogenes will insist on their mutual incompatibility. In his lectures at the Collège the following year, Foucault will appear to side with Diogenes, at least if the concepts of truth and virtue at issue are Platonic.

Since his archaeological studies, Foucault has often referred to transformations and displacements. He now notes a displacement of the parrhesiastic role from the well-born Athenian and the political leader to the philosopher, Socrates. Starting with the Laches, which he had analyzed earlier, he observes the emergence of this new type of philosophical parrhesia in classical antiquity. He distinguishes three roles that it played in Greco-Roman culture: epistemological, political, and a role linking truth with an ethics and aesthetics of the self. Insisting that the philosophical parrhesia which appeared in Greco-Roman culture is not primarily a concept or a theme but a practice which tries to shape the specific relations individuals have with themselves, he adds: “I think that our own moral subjectivity is rooted, at least in part, in these practices.” (106)

What I referred to earlier as an “asceticism” is brought into play when Foucault cites the theme of changing one’s life, of “conversion,” as the object of this new parrhesia. What this parrhesiastic contract requires is a series of practices (what others like Pierre Hadot will call “spiritual exercises”) in a reciprocal relation of growing self-knowledge and increased access to truth. He devotes his last two lectures respectively to the practices of parrhesia both in human relationships and by means of techniques to be learned and applied in achieving the character of the parrhesiast.

He sketches three kinds of human relationships implied in this new philosophical parrhesia and links each to a prominent ethical school in the Greco-Roman world. The Epicureans stressed friendship and valued parrhesiastic practices in the context of community life. The Cynics emphasized parrhesia in the setting of public life. Public activity or public demonstration played a major role in Cynic thought. Finally, “parrhesia as an aspect of personal relationships is found more frequently either in Stoicism or in a generalized or common Stoicism characteristic of such writers as Plutarch”(108). Foucault warns that these are “only guiding examples” and he cites a number of exceptions and counter-examples to his generalizations. But his elaboration of these forms is rich in illustrations, many of which are repeated in his lectures at the Collège.

Foucault’s final lecture addresses what elsewhere he calls “practices of the self” and in this context “techniques of the parrhesiastic games which can be found in the philosophical and moral literature of the first two centuries of our era”(142). These involve practices that enable the individual to discover and appropriate truths about himself. They incorporate what the Greeks call askesis and involve such exercises as “examination of conscience, “ meditation and self-testing. The resultant insight is more practical than theoretical. Its goal is an “aesthetics of the self”—a concept that will reappear as “aesthetics of existence” in the second volume of his History of Sexuality.

It has always struck me that Foucault saves the best for last in both his books and his lectures. True, the text sometimes assumes an apocalyptic tone at that point. But more frequently it turns back on itself in a recapitulation from a synthetic viewpoint that is stunning in its cohesive power. We get a taste of this in the slightly more than four pages that constitute the conclusion of these lectures and this book. After reviewing the “problematization of truth which characterizes both the end of Presocratic philosophy and the beginning of the kind of philosophy which is still ours today”, he turns to the two major aspects of that problematization, namely, the tradition of the “analytics of truth” and the “critical” tradition in Western philosophy. The analytic is concerned with determining how to ensure that a statement is true whereas the critical has its roots in questions about “the importance of telling the truth, knowing who is able to tell the truth and knowing why we should tell the truth” (170). He now informs us that the general objective of the seminar was “to construct a genealogy of the critical attitude in Western philosophy” (170-171). This said, it seems rather anti-climactic to defend his use of “problematization” from criticisms of “historical idealism” or indifference to concrete historical contexts. Yet even here the account is illuminating and extends the discussion by implication to all of his problematizing texts across the years.

In sum, this is an important Foucauldian document and, at least until the encompassing lectures from the Collège are published, a highly necessary one.