Feeling Lonesome: The Philosophy and Psychology of Loneliness

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Ben Lazare Mijuskovic, Feeling Lonesome: The Philosophy and Psychology of Loneliness, Praeger, 2015, 203pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781440840289.

Reviewed by Matthew Ratcliffe, University of Vienna


You might think that loneliness is a contingent state: people feel lonely for a time or lonely in a place, and some people are constitutionally lonely, but most people are not lonely all the time and human life is not necessarily lonely. Not according to Ben Lazare Mijuskovic. He maintains that all such conditions are symptomatic of a loneliness that is "universal and necessary" (1). We need not be aware of it all the time, but it is always there, lurking in the background. Human life inevitably takes the form of a struggle against loneliness. We reach out to others in order to avoid sinking into complete isolation. However, although they might provide us with some degree of consolation and felt connection, our loneliness is something that can never be overcome.

The image of human life offered in this book is not an uplifting one: we are all nailed shut in our private coffins, frantically scratching at a corner in order to sustain a faint glimmer of light that will eventually be extinguished, if not by resignation to loneliness in life then by eventual death. What does this necessary loneliness consist of though, and why endorse such a view? According to Mijuskovic, loneliness is not principally about an inability or felt inability to relate to others. One reaches out to others because one is already lonely, only "after one has initially felt, acknowledged and understood the pervasive sense of isolation that haunts the human soul" (3). Our isolation is the inevitable consequence of a self-awareness that arises prior to and thus independently of intersubjective development. In order to elaborate and support this view, the first four chapters take us on a swift tour through the history of Western philosophy.

However, before this gets going, the first move is to insist that self-awareness is independent of interpersonal and social relations. We are told that infants "achieve self-consciousness before they are aware of the mother as a distinct consciousness" (3). The only evidence offered is that Harry Harlow's motherless monkeys were self-conscious, given that they remained able to interact with inanimate objects and to survive. No argument is supplied for the claim that such abilities require self-consciousness, even if it is admitted that these animals were, in some way, "aware" of their surroundings. Mijuskovic states that the "self becomes self-aware of its distinction from a sphere of inanimate objects and only later from the mother as a distinct other self" (p.5). Yet it is unclear why one has to be "self-aware", rather than simply "aware". How did the "self-" creep in here? I am not sure what it is to be "self-aware" in the relevant sense or why socially-deprived monkeys should be regarded as self-aware in that sense. Although Mijuskovic does return to the topic of child development later in the book, such concerns are not, so far as I can see, satisfactorily addressed.

The next -- and much lengthier -- step in the argument involves showing that pre-social self-awareness renders us necessarily lonely. This involves dividing much of the history of Western philosophy into two broad camps. On one side, we have "materialism, empiricism, phenomenalism, nominalism, behavioral therapy, evidence-based practices, and science". On the other, we have "idealism, rationalism, phenomenology, existentialism, conceptualism, insight-oriented therapy, and humanism" (8). Mijuskovic sides with the latter, on the basis that the former does not give us a sufficiently robust notion of self or self-consciousness. Once we have this, the impossibility of cognitive access to other selves is supposed to follow. Although numerous different philosophers and philosophical positions are discussed, the argument is essentially that every self is distinct from all other selves and has privileged access to its own experiences and thoughts. Therefore, it cannot know (or fully know, or know with certainty) another self: "Simply put, if all I can 'know' are my own ideas and perceptions, how can I ever vanquish loneliness? How can I reach the other conscious being with any sense of certainty?" (49). So it comes down to a fairly standard formulation of the epistemological problem of other minds, along with the insistence that it cannot be solved.

I found all of this unconvincing. Mijuskovic concedes from the outset that our most fundamental metaphysical and epistemological commitments are not products of rational thought. One's underlying philosophical orientation arises out of and is consistent with one's feelings; it involves "the heart and not the head" (7). I have some sympathy with that view. However, in this context, there is the worry that Mijuskovic just ends up cherry-picking and interpreting philosophers to fit a pre-established conception of irrevocable loneliness. It is not clear what work is actually being done by philosophical argument. Dividing a wide range of different philosophical traditions and positions into two general categories is likely to strike many readers as simplistic.

In addition, Mijuskovic tries to cover so much material so quickly that he cannot do justice to much of it or offer a strong enough case for many of his own interpretations. For instance, he tells us that "Husserl has drawn all the curtains and sealed all his exits" (98). Unsurprisingly, this is consistent with Mijuskovic's own account of our necessary isolation, but it is far from being an uncontentious interpretation of Husserl. Anyone who does not want to be stuck with an irresolvable problem of other minds could simply appeal to an alternative reading of Husserl or take other philosophers as authoritative. For instance, one might throw in a bit of Heidegger instead and maintain that the idea of an isolated, self-conscious subject is a misleading abstraction that presupposes but fails to acknowledge an already given social world; one is with others before one is alone. Or one could adopt a less dismissive attitude towards the later Wittgenstein than Mijuskovic does. His own treatments are too cursory to rule out such alternatives. I therefore doubt that Mijuskovic will manage to sway anybody who is not already convinced of his position. That said, there are numerous references in these chapters to previous works by the author. So I acknowledge the possibility that some or all of this will appear more palatable when situated in the context of his other writings on loneliness.

In the second half of the book, Mijuskovic turns from the "cognitive" aspect of loneliness to its "affective" and "motivational" dimensions. This part of his discussion addresses a wide range of topics and themes, including child development, loneliness in literature, language and consciousness, the unconscious, and therapy. Loneliness, it becomes clearer, involves a hankering after something that is impossible; we reach out to others affectively in order to resist something that can never be entirely overcome (given the cognitive isolation already described). Our necessary loneliness can be felt to varying degrees and in different ways but, in all cases, loneliness is not a simply state, amenable to crisp philosophical definition. Rather, loneliness is an "umbrella concept", and a range of different aspects hang together in relationships of mutual implication. Hence, Mijuskovic suggests, it is much better conveyed through literature than through certain styles of philosophizing; overly precise language cannot capture the vague and ambiguous realities of loneliness-experience. In my view, these four chapters of the book are more interesting and -- in certain respects -- more convincing than the preceding four. There are all sorts of insightful remarks on loneliness in literature. Also notable is the plausible connection Mijuskovic makes between loneliness and hostility. The two, he says, are inextricable: "As we become alienated from other conscious beings, we inevitably become resentful and angry" (106). In both cases, though, the discussion would have benefited from further development. For instance, although the relationship between loneliness and individual aggression seems plausible, the claim that loneliness also rests at the heart of hostile political movements could have been further explored and defended. It might have been better to have ditched the high-speed trip through the history of philosophy and instead elaborated upon themes such as these.

Many other claims in these later chapters similarly struck me as plausible or at least worthy of further discussion. There is something to be said for the view that life involves a continuing struggle against loneliness. I also think Mijuskovic is right to emphasize the extent of our dependence upon others, how loneliness lies at the heart of most psychiatric illness, and how much of human life can be characterized in terms of a tension between loneliness and belonging. However, by the time I got to the end of the book, I was left wondering why the philosophical account of "cognitive" isolation was needed at all. This isolation, more than anything else, is used to support Mijuskovic's bleak assessment of human life, as something driven by an underlying recognition of inescapable solitary confinement:

each of us lives alone within the realm of our own mind, nestled inside our cocoons and revolving spheres of consoling fantasies and crippling anxieties. Thus, the most important insight is to realize that life consists in an endless struggle over our sense of loneliness, which only releases its grip over us in death. (174)

Mijuskovic does at least concede that we are not completely imprisoned within our own minds. Although a kind of cognitive contact can never be achieved, a degree of affective communion with others is possible. He sketches an account of empathy as a "motivational" and also "ethical" relation (188), something that involves a "shared union constituted by the same feelings, understanding, and insight into the emotions of care and concern experienced by both" (189). So why not just settle for the view that this is something we need and seek but do not always find, thus disposing us towards loneliness? By analogy, that we have to eat in order to survive does not make us necessarily hungry at every moment of our lives, and we do not immerse ourselves in eating so as to provide only partial relief from our underlying, inescapable hunger. At the same time, we can never escape the disposition towards hunger. Similarly, perhaps it is enough to say that the nature and degree of our dependence upon others renders us inevitably susceptible to loneliness of various kinds and that no social relation could ever serve to remove this susceptibility. Why suppose, alongside this, that loneliness has something to do with seeking to bridge an unbridgeable "cognitive" gulf? Mijuskovic plausibly remarks that the "worst fate a human being can experience is to be ignored, unrecognized, unacknowledged: not to exist in the eyes of others" (117). He also notes that: "We always need the other self as a 'sounding board', as a means of reverberating our feelings and thoughts. We cannot survive psychologically, emotionally, or intellectually without the external, reciprocating 'other' human or sentient agent." (184)

So it seems that what we seek from others is recognition, trust, and emotional connection, not an impossible cognitive fusion. And retention of the essential difference between self and other is surely a prerequisite for the intelligibility of such relations; others can recognize or fail to recognize me in a way that I cannot recognize or fail to recognize myself. It is not clear how a sense of affective communion with others impacts upon the (alleged) cognitive separation of self from others, or why it would need to. Neither is it clear why bridging the epistemic gap, even if it were possible, should mitigate the painful sense of affective isolation that is central to many experiences of loneliness (at least in the absence of an accompanying feeling of being connected to another person). So I worry that the problem of other minds, as formulated in the first part of the book, may turn out to be not only philosophically suspect but also irrelevant. Better, perhaps, to stress the extent to which we are social beings, and how a disposition towards loneliness arises inevitably from this, than to insist that loneliness originates in an entombed self-awareness that precedes interpersonal needs and relations.