Feeling Pain and Being in Pain

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Nikola Grahek, Feeling Pain and Being in Pain (2nd Edition), MIT Press, 2007, 168pp., $30.00 (hbk), ISBN 0262072831.

Reviewed by Murat Aydede, University of British Columbia


This book is primarily about dissociation syndromes in pain experience.  Grahek discusses two forms of dissociations in particular: pain without painfulness and painfulness without pain.  The book title alludes to the former kind as Grahek spends more time on it and identifies pain asymbolia as the only clear-cut cases where someone "feels pain" but is not "in pain."  The main contribution of this book lies in a clear and careful analysis of a good chunk of empirical literature in order to find out what these dissociations actually are, how they differ from each other and from other pain abnormalities such as congenital indifference to noxious stimuli (general congenital analgesia), and what they teach us about the "true nature and structure of human pain experience."  Along the way Grahek also mounts arguments against what he calls subjectivist and objectivist views of pain, and he concludes his book with a brief discussion of the "hard problem" of consciousness in the context of pain.

The book is usefully divided into eight chapters with more or less clear objectives.  The first chapter is a short and useful introduction that also lays out the plan of the book.  The second chapter is an exploration of the biological function of pain.  Grahek uses a variety of examples from the empirical literature to bring out the biological significance of pain.  One of the easiest ways to appreciate pain's importance is to look at those patients who suffer from congenital analgesia (or, insensitivity or indifference to noxious stimuli).  These patients cannot feel pain at all.  So harmful or potentially harmful (noxious) stimuli don't cause pain in these patients, but nevertheless these stimuli are usually registered (sensorially) as sharp cuts, incisions, hard blows, very warm surfaces, loud sounds, etc.  In other words, the standard sensory modalities, including tactile sense, are usually intact in these patients who nevertheless suffer from a complete shutdown of the pain system.  As a result, they have to meticulously learn and remind themselves what kinds of sensations are signals for harmful stimuli.  But many of these patients suffer from serious cuts, bruises, burns, and other sorts of injuries early in their lives.  These injuries tend not to be protected from further assault and thus are not given any chance to heal, and they become chronic conditions.  Most patients don't live past their twenties due to various complications.  There are other cases that Grahek discusses such as people who suffer from leprosy, as discussed by Brand and Yancey (1997).[1]  Leprosy Bacilli destroy the peripheral receptors (nociceptors) specialized for detecting mechanical, thermal, and chemical noxious stimuli.  As a result, these patients, although they generally know what it is like to experience pain, don't feel pain in those body parts with destroyed nociceptors (often, the hands).

Grahek's analyses of these cases are rich and often insightful.  Following the scientific practice, he notes two essential functions of pain, and describes some of the main underlying neural mechanisms.  One is protective, the other restorative.  The former has the function of preventing an organism from being injured.  But if the injury couldn't be avoided, the latter has the job of preventing the injury from sustaining further trauma and therefore allowing it to heal.  Both are essential and seem to be served at least partly by different neural conduction mechanisms (the restorative function of pain seems to be subserved at least partly by so-called "silent" C-chemo-fibers).

Toward the end of the chapter, Grahek discusses a particularly interesting case history of a patient who suffered lesions in his right parietal cortex.  He calls the syndrome threat hypersymbolia.  This is the case of a patient who suddenly starts feeling burning pain in his left hand upon seeing something approaching it which also causes the sudden (involuntary) withdrawal of the hand.  This is a case of pain evoked completely by visual stimuli.  It turns out that the brain damage sustained by this patient involves an area (area 7b) in the right parietal cortex populated by polymodal neurons that respond both to visual and noxious somatosensory stimuli directed toward the right hand (area 7b will show up again later in the book where Grahek discusses pain asymbolia).  This area is clearly involved in learning the meaning of certain kinds of potential physical threats approaching one's left hand.  Unfortunately, as Grahek speculates, the patient has incurred the damage to this area at that stage of the neural circuitry where the association between visually detected threats to his hand and the pain he feels there could not be unlearned.  Grahek's discussion of this case is rich and full of insights extending beyond the observation of a pain system gone astray, a system that can no longer fulfill its biological function.

Chapters 3 through 5 deal with pain without painfulness.  After going over some putative cases (prefrontal lobotomy, cingulatomy, morphine induced analgesia -- the comparison between them will be taken up later by Grahek in Chapter 7), Grahek concludes that pain asymbolia is the only clear-cut and pure case of such a dissociation where one feels pain and identifies one's experience as pain but does not find one's experience in the least bit unpleasant.  In the literature, this is usually explained as a case where the sensory-discriminative dimension of one's pain is more or less intact while the motivational-affective dimension is not functioning.  Indeed pain asymbolics can identify and discriminate the spatial and temporal features of their pain experiences without showing any distress or aversive behavior.  Grahek nicely presents the scientific literature on the symptomology of pain asymbolia as well as what is known about the underlying neural basis of this syndrome, oftentimes insightfully connecting the dots in a way that is not always clear from a superficial survey of the relevant literature.  It turns out that pain asymbolic patients have almost invariably sustained brain damage in the posterior insula and the parietal operculum, including brain area 7b.  Neurons in these areas have complex functions but one thing seems relatively clear: they respond to threatening visual as well as noxious somatosensory stimuli.  The integration of noxious somatosensory stimuli with visual stimuli is absolutely necessary in almost all vertebrates.  Somatosensory detection of where and how noxious stimuli are being received in one's body is of little use unless the animal can visually coordinate threat specific behavioral responses -- obvious exceptions to this are various motor reflexes to noxious stimuli (but these hardly may be called "coordination").  Thus it is not surprising that all these brain areas have strong and direct connections to motor areas of the brain as well.  Damage to these areas often leaves the organism incapable of appreciating the impending physical threat and intrusion to its body.  The impairment of asymbolic patients is usually so profound that the patients are incapable of forming any new memories of relevant associations between noxious and visual stimuli, and tying them to aversive behavior.  They also often seem to have forgotten all that's been learned.

Although Grahek's critical and integrative presentation of this literature is impeccable and connects many dots, it still leaves open the question of why the pain the asymbolic patients feel in a bodily location doesn't hurt or is not at all unpleasant.  So let's grant that mere inability to associate the somatosensory noxious stimulus with its visual presentation will leave the patient oblivious to similar threatening visual stimuli in the future.  This doesn't explain why the somatosensory detection of noxious stimuli is not experienced as painful, as hurting, by the asymbolics -- even though it is experienced and conceptually identified as pain.  Blind people don't tend to suffer from pain asymbolia.  So the question still remains: in virtue of what functional feature and connectivity of the neurons in area 7b is the somatosensory experience of noxious stimuli not experienced as painful or unpleasant?  My own intuition after reading this literature is that this area is the primary gateway between the incoming somatosensory nociceptive information and motor areas -- motor areas whose activity controlling the aversive behavior is to be coordinated with incoming visual information.  In other words, it isn't the failure of integration with visual information that is responsible for lack of felt hurt, but rather the failure of the results of sensory-discriminatory analysis to reach the motor areas at all. The sense in which we are interested in pain without hurt (painfulness) is primarily phenomenological.  When we say that the negative affect (hurt) is missing in asymbolic patients, we mean to say, among other things, that there is a qualitative difference in their pain experience.  The negative affective quality missing in their experience seems to be essentially of a motivational, moving (emotio) nature.  My conjecture is that this nature cannot be captured with a mechanism that doesn't involve motor or at least immediate pre-motor processing ready to deliver visually coordinated actual motor responses.  If "affective qualia" are to be naturalized, in other words, they could only be naturalized by reducing them into information processing mechanisms hardwired to move their possessor, or at least, to make them ready to move.

Chapter 6, titled "Conceptual and Theoretical Implications of Pain Asymbolia," is where Grahek draws a lot philosophical lessons from the discussion of pain asymbolia.  One lesson he draws, as many others before him did, is that normal pain experiences are phenomenologically complex and that various qualitative components of a pain experience can and under certain circumstances do come apart.  Grahek also thinks that pain asymbolia cases decisively show that two commonly held philosophical views, the subjectivist and objectivist views of pain, are false.

Grahek characterizes the subjectivist view as follows: "the sensation of pain with its distinctive phenomenal content or quality -- the 'what-it-is-likeness' of pain -- is the essential component of our total pain experience and plays the central or fundamental role in it" (p. 76).  He takes 'the sensation of pain' to refer to the distinctive quality associated with the sensory-discriminative aspect of pain experiences which he presumes is preserved in pain asymbolic patients.  His criticism basically consists in pointing out that when the negative ("painful") quality associated with the emotional-affective aspect of pain is gone, the pain sensation ceases to function in the way pain experiences normally function -- to protect the body from physical damage and help healing when damage has already occurred.  I am not sure who holds the subjectivist view as stated.  I am a bit puzzled by Grahek's discussion here because I thought the point of the subjective view is to make a metaphysical claim about the nature of pain: that it is essentially subjective, first-personal, perspectival (or something along these lines).  It is a metaphysical thesis.  Why should the pains of asymbolic patients pose a problem for such a view?  As long as there is a core phenomenal state, however its causal role might have changed or become ineffective, the view should say that this core is essentially subjective.  Grahek doesn't deny the existence of this pain specific sensory quality.  In fact in the following chapter he himself argues that there is an important classificatory function that this quality plays.  Certainly, the pain experience of pain asymbolic patients must subjectively feel different insofar as the negative affective quality is missing, but it must also subjectively feel similar as the sensory quality remains.  It may be that, because of this, the causal role of these abnormal experiences is different.  But I don't see how this should make trouble for the subjectivist view.  (As Grahek states it, the view seems to incorporate a functional/causal claim, and this may be problematic in the light of pain asymbolic patients.  But I see no reason why the subjectivist should insist on incorporating this functional element -- just the opposite, if I were a subjectivist, I would insist not adducing any causal role claim to my subjectivism about pain for obvious reasons.)

Grahek's discussion of objectivism is a little less disorienting but still puzzling.  His target here is the perceptual/representational views of pain, according to which pain experiences are essentially perceptual experiences: they are perceptions of actual or potential tissue damage.  Although Grahek runs them together, representationalism about pain is a distinct thesis.  In its strong version as defended by Tye,[2] it says that the phenomenal content of pain experiences is strictly identical to their representational content so that they cannot come apart in any possible world.  Grahek's objection to this view runs as follows:

the pain these [asymbolic] patients feel does not represent for them any damage or potential damage to their bodies.  That this is so is best proved by the fact that they consistently smile or laugh during pain testing procedures.  If that is the case, one can safely claim that the sensation of pain does not carry, by itself, any representational force; that, when present alone, it comes to nothing in the sense that it in no way carries the "meaning" of physical damage or at least threat to physical well-being.  So … the feeling of pain cannot, when taken alone, be understood as the perception or representation of bodily or tissue damage.  In other words, it seems that the representational force of pain is rather to be sought in the emotional-cognitive component of pain.  (p. 80)

Several responses can be made to this.  First, it is certainly open to the defender of a perceptual/representational view to claim that even if the sensation of pain isn't perceptual or representational when isolated, it is when not isolated.  Second, it might be said, how the patients themselves react to their own pain (they laugh or smile) is irrelevant.  The sensory quality, as long as it is there and regularly caused by tissue damage, is a perceptual experience of damage or represents damage.  To give an analogy, suppose driving on the road in a desert you come across a road sign alerting you of falling rocks.  Well, you would laugh at it, wouldn't you?  In fact you would laugh at it precisely because the sign represents what it does (it purports to indicate threat and danger ahead).  What a signal indicates (or represents, for that matter) doesn't always depend on how we interpret it.  Strong representationalism is a reductive metaphysical doctrine about the qualitative character or content of experiences -- it identifies this content with representational content.  The fact that the pain asymbolics don't themselves take seriously the sensory quality they feel and identify correctly as pain doesn't show that the metaphysical nature of this quality isn't representational.  Third, it is not entirely clear that asymbolic patients never take, or more importantly, can never take, their sensation to represent physical damage and threat.  It is unfortunate that the relevant case studies are moot on this point -- they were not recorded or commented on carefully, at least not with the kind of care and curiosity a philosopher would have.  And finally, Grahek makes a puzzling remark about where the "representational force" of pain experiences resides: in the emotional-cognitive component of pain.  This is puzzling for at least two reasons.  First, it shows that Grahek seems willing to admit that pain experiences are or can be perceptual or representational only when their phenomenal complexity is intact -- when the sensory component comes fused with the emotional-cognitive component.  But then, I really doubt whether the perceptualists and representationalists about pain, at least in philosophy, have ever thought or cared about the phenomenal complexity of pain experiences, let alone identified the "representational force" of pain experiences with their sensory component.  This wasn't generally an issue historically.  Their target wasn't which component of pain experiences is perceptual or representational: they were arguing against the anti-perceptualists or anti-representationalists.  Secondly, it is implausible to claim that the representational force of pain experiences ought to be sought in the emotional-cognitive component if by this Grahek means the negative affective component.  If you find it plausible to claim that the sensory component of pain experiences doesn't represent, then you should find it even more plausible to claim that the affective component doesn't represent -- if something doesn't seem representational at all in this area, it is the pain affect, not the pain sensation.

The following chapter (Ch. 7) on "Pain Quality and Painfulness without Pain" is one of the best chapters of the book, and its title seriously underdescribes its content.  Although they are obviously related, Grahek discusses four different topics.  First, he insightfully reflects on the nature and function of the "pain quality" that the asymbolic patients feel and correctly identify as pain.  Following Roger Trigg (1970),[3] Grahek thinks that there are important roles this distinctive quality of pain plays.  It distinguishes sensory pain from mental pain or suffering; it differentiates pains from other unpleasant sensations that are not pains; and, it unifies pain experiences by differentiating them from phenomenally similar (pleasant or unpleasant) experiences that are not pains.  The second topic Grahek discusses is naturally raised by the first: are there experiences that are painful but lack the distinctive quality of pain, and yet are not easily categorized under other unpleasant experiences?  The answer seems to be yes: Grahek goes over a recent case study examined by Ploner and his colleagues of a patient with selective lesions in the right primary and secondary somatosensory areas in his brain (SI and SII).  When the patient's left hand is stimulated by the researchers by cutaneous laser that normally evokes intense but locally precise heat pain, Ploner et al. write:

[At higher intensities of cutaneous laser stimulation] the patient spontaneously described a "clearly unpleasant" intensity-dependent feeling emerging from an ill-localized area "somewhere between fingertips and shoulder" that he wanted to avoid.  The fully cooperative and eloquent patient was completely unable to further describe quality, localization, and intensity of the perceived stimulus.  Suggestions from a given list containing "warm," "hot," "cold," "touch," "burning," "pinprick-like," "slight pain," "moderate pain," and "intense pain" were denied. (Ploner et al., 1999; 213)[4]

This study has been much discussed in the literature.  It seems to be the only non-controversial case of dissociation of pain affect from pain sensation.  It is striking.  Grahek's coverage of the case is adequate, although what he concludes about it is not: "… it is obvious that both [the sensory and affective components] are necessary, but neither of them is a sufficient condition for pain" (p. 111).  What the Ploner case seems to show is that the affective component is not sufficient.  Where do we get the conclusion that it is necessary?  In fact the pain asymbolic cases seem to show that an experience can be correctly categorized as pain although the experience lacks the affective component.

Given the title, one might expect that the chapter would end here.  But Grahek goes on to discuss two more topics, which could have easily formed the basis of a useful separate chapter.  One topic is the differences, if any, among cases that have traditionally been classified as cases of pains without painfulness.  Grahek wants to differentiate pain asymbolia from all the rest, such as the conditions of those patients who underwent prefrontal lobotomies or a cingulatomy, as well as the conditions of those patients who were administered morphine for their pain (these are generally known to induce some form of pain without painfulness).  Relying on various scientific sources, Grahek makes a strong case for not assimilating the latter cases to pain asymbolia as far as their symptomology and phenomenology are concerned.  He thinks that the nature of dissociation in these two classes of cases is importantly different.  The pain asymbolic patients don't feel any unpleasantness simultaneously accompanying (or fused with) their pain sensation.  But the patients in the other cases do feel the ongoing unpleasantness -- indeed they bitterly complain about their pains when their attention is directed to them, and they show all the standard bodily signs of aversive reaction.  They seem to experience a "hurting" pain.  But they generally don't worry and are not concerned about them.  They have no future-directed concerns about their present hurting pain, and if they have ongoing chronic pain that is painful, they seem not worry about it, not to mind it.  What they seem to lack is a more complex (perhaps even second-order) emotional attitude toward their experience and its significance, as well as toward their overall condition.[5]  According to Grahek, pain asymbolia is the only clear-cut case of pain without any painfulness or hurt.

Grahek's last topic in Chapter 7 is a sustained polemic with those scientists who seem to confuse various cases of insensitivity to noxious stimuli (congenital analgesia) with cases of insensitivity to pain (involving various forms of dissociation effects of pains without painfulness).  Grahek's discussion here is thorough, careful and detailed.  It is a helpful discussion with practical implications.

The last chapter of the book ("C-Fibers and All That") disappoints.  The ostensible target here is philosophers' obsession with C-fibers when they discuss pains or use pain as an example of a prototypical phenomenal state.  Grahek seems to think that most philosophers are serious when they bring up C-fibers as candidates for identification with pains, and then he proceeds to beat them up for that.  I am not sure what to make of this.  I personally know of no philosopher who would sincerely take C-fibers as serious candidates for the neural substratum of pain experiences.  C-fibers are (and always have been -- as far as I can tell) used in the literature as a sort of stand-in or proxy for whatever the ultimate physical structure is to be identified with pain experience (in case the Identity Theory is your game) or for whatever it is that turns out to be the occupant of the functional role of pains (if Functionalism is your preferred game).  As Grahek points out, along with A-delta fibers C-fibers are specialized peripheral nerve fibers ubiquitous in the body (they are not even part of the central nervous system).  Grahek goes over the history of their discovery and the psychophysics of pain detection in some detail.  I think this is the most valuable aspect of this chapter, not Grahek's criticism of philosophers who have talked about C-fibers.  Grahek ends the chapter with some brief discussion of the hard problem of consciousness and the explanatory gap as it arises in the case of pain experiences.  I have found this brief discussion very obscure and extremely hard to follow, so I set it aside in this review.

If you are interested in what philosophical lessons we can learn from a careful and detailed study of pain dissociation phenomena, this book will likely disappoint you.  But if you want to learn about these fascinating phenomena themselves, and what the empirical literature offers about their phenomenology, symptomology, psychology, and neuroscience, this is your book.  When Grahek goes over the literature, his presentation is careful, clear, and insightful, connecting many dots at many levels at once.  It is also rightly critical bringing the scrutiny and curiosity of a philosopher with a clearly restless mind.  This is where the book excels and shall satisfy most readers.[6]

[1] Brand, P. and P. Yancey. (1997). The Gift Nobody Wants, Michigan: Zondervan.  Grahek refers to and quotes from this work many times throughout his book.

[2] Grahek quotes from Michael Tye's 1995 book, Ten Problems of Consciousness (Cambridge, Massachusetts: MIT Press).

[3] Trigg, Roger. (1970). Emotion and Pain, Oxford: Clarendon.

[4] Ploner, M., H.-J. Freund and A. Schnitzler (1999). "Pain Affect without Pain Sensation in a Patient with a Postcentral Lesion," Pain 81: 211-14.

[5] Don Price draws a similar distinction between the "moment-to-moment" unpleasantness of pain experiences and their "secondary affect."  See his Psychological Mechanisms of Pain and Analgesia (Progress in pain Research and Management, Vol. 15, Seattle: IASP Press, 1999).

[6] I came to know Nikola Grahek through correspondence when he'd kindly sent me a copy of the first edition of his book.  Although he didn't know about it, I was then editing a volume on pain that was later published by MIT Press.  After reading his book, I immediately asked him whether he could contribute a piece to the volume.  I was delighted when he kindly agreed.  About a year later, I was deeply saddened when I learned that he had passed away.