Feelings Transformed: Philosophical Theories of the Emotions, 1270-1670

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Dominik Perler, Feelings Transformed: Philosophical Theories of the Emotions, 1270-1670, Tony Crawford (tr.), Oxford University Press, 2018, 350pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199383481.

Reviewed by  Simo Knuuttila, University of Helsinki


This is a translation of Dominik Perler's Transformationen der Gefühle (S. Fischer, 2011). In five chapters, Perler describes and analyzes theories of emotions and their conceptual background structures in influential late medieval and early modern authors: 1. Thomas Aquinas: Emotions as Sensual Movements, 2. John Duns Scotus and William of Ockham: Emotions in the Will, 3. Michel de Montaigne: A Skeptical View of Emotions, 4. René Descartes: A Dualist View of Emotions, and 5. Baruch de Spinoza: Emotions as Psychophysical Units. The main chapters are preceded by an Introduction that discusses the philosophical study of emotions in general and the analysis of emotions in the history of philosophy. The concluding chapter is about the theories discussed and their metaphysical biases with considerations of the theoretical scope developed in the book.

Perler is interested in the investigation of emotions in contemporary philosophy of mind and he wants to discuss, in a non-anachronistic way, analogous themes in six classical thinkers who wrote extensively about emotions. His general thesis is that comparing the contemporary philosophical discussions with the classical ones may help us to see new aspects in historical theories and vice versa. While this general orientation forms the background of the work, it is a contribution to the philosophical history of philosophy rather than to contemporary philosophical psychology, even though the author holds that an awareness of the historical theories clarifies the conceptual settings of the philosophy of emotions in general. Perler is an active and often quoted author on historical and systematic approaches in the philosophy of mind; he is the author of many English articles on the history of emotions, an editor of The Faculties: A History (OUP 2015), and co-editor of Partitioning the Soul: Debates from Plato to Leibniz (de Gruyter 2014).

In the present book, Perler does not argue for any strong conception of philosophical progress, but is interested in the conceptual differences between the historical theories analyzed and their relative strength and weaknesses. The main point is to show how the high-level analyses of emotions by authors from Aquinas to Spinoza were conditioned by various philosophical positions with respect to the mind-body problem and by other metaphysical background assumptions pertaining to the unity, structure, categorization, ascription, and imputation of emotions. One motivation for adopting this perspective is the widely held thesis that the idea of mechanist science combined with seventeenth-century rationalist metaphysics essentially shaped early modern approaches to traditional philosophical questions and introduced a profound paradigm change in the philosophy of emotions. Perler argues that the theories of emotions in Descartes's dualism and Spinoza's substance monism are in agreement with this popular view to some extent, but as for the understanding of the approaches to emotional phenomena, speaking about a radical break in the philosophical tradition is not fully justified. He shows that there were important theoretical differences in medieval theories, most obviously disclosed by the innovative theories of the passions of the will in Scotus and Ockham. Perler presents Montaigne's skeptical philosophy as a further example of how deviating from the received metaphysical psychology affected talk about emotions. Apart from these diverse orientations and the self-confident criticism of earlier theories in Descartes and Spinoza, there were also many similarities in how the phenomena of the emotions were understood in alternative theories, particularly in recognizing them and identifying their components in accordance with ancient paradigms.

The book is meant for historians of philosophy and for readers who, without being professional scholars in this area, take an interest in philosophical approaches to the emotions. For this reason, Perler offers a great number of commonsense examples of how various historical claims could be understood using everyday introspection. Even though there are lots of references to research literature in the footnotes and bibliography, the author mostly uses everyday introspection rather than entering into the scholarly debate, although this is not wholly absent. The primary aim is to familiarize readers with the arguments about the structure of the emotions from Aquinas to Spinoza and the changing metaphysical frameworks involved in these approaches. The term "transformation" in the book's title indicates this historical process, but it is also said to refer to the ideas of the controllability and intentional changeability of emotions as part of the theories of inner experience and consistent action in historical authors.

The chapter on Aquinas begins with a discussion of the metaphysical assumptions in Aquinas's hylomorphistic conception of the soul and its faculties, particularly the mechanisms of the sensory faculties embedded in the hierarchical structure of the powers of the soul. The theory of emotions as anchored in the acts of the sensory moving powers was discussed by many authors before Aquinas; it was influenced by the faculty psychology of Avicenna and the early thirteenth-century division between the pairs of opposite concupiscible emotions and opposite irascible emotions. Perler does not enter into this background and its influence on Aquinas's taxonomy of emotions or Aquinas's own contribution that was the application of Aristotle's division of the types of movements in the Physics as the basis for explaining the opposite pairs in his classification. Some attention to these matters would have been welcome even though Perler apparently regards the analysis of the formal object of emotion as philosophically more interesting, and also sufficient, for Aquinas's taxonomy of emotions. The notion of formal object is associated with the intentional and cognitive aspects of emotions that typically motivate behavioral changes in humans and animals. The discussion of the formal object is helpful in spite of the fact that Aquinas does not use the term in this context, as Perler himself notes. The last part of this chapter is about how the emotional and rational faculties co-operate in controlling the emotions and forming virtues; this question is also dealt with in the papers by Perler and by Terence Irwin in Alix Cohen and Robert Stern (eds.), Thinking about the Emotions (Oxford, 2017).

The chapter about Scotus and Ockham discusses the role of emotions in voluntarist philosophical anthropology. While Perler follows the scholars who have interpreted Scotus's view of the passions of the will as non-chosen pleasant or unpleasant states caused by affecting representations, he argues that Ockham pushes Scotus's theory in the direction of basically all volitions being regarded as emotions. Even though Ockham puts forward this kind of formulation in some places, one may wonder what he had in mind because he elsewhere followed the kernel of Scotus's account of pleasure and distress as the passions of the will, calling them merely passions as distinct from the passions that are acts. Some thinkers call free volitions designated by emotion terms pseudo-passions -- is this how Ockham's view should be understood? Differing from Vesa Hirvonen's approach in Passions in William Ockham's Philosophical Psychology (Kluwer 2004), Perler does not pay much attention to Ockham's distinction between structurally different passions of the will; a little more exegetical analysis and semantic consideration of the terms "passion" and "emotion" would have been helpful here. It is noted that the absolute acts of the voluntarist free will such as love or dislike are simply caused by the will itself; in what sense are these passions? Before these discussions, Perler describes Ockham's view of the really distinct parts or levels of the soul and the metaphysics of the free will located in the intellectual part, all this being very different from the tenets of Thomist Aristotelianism and its view of the co-operation between the faculties.

Perler then discusses Montaigne's essays on various emotions and their connection with his Pyrrhonian skepticism that prevented any theoretical account of their structures and inner causal connections typical of scholastic metaphysical psychology. Montaigne's literary approach is based on popular ancient works and reports of his own likes and dislikes. Perler critically addresses various suggestions about a possible theoretical background (such as nominalism, constructivism or cultural relativism) apart from skepticism in Montaigne's approach. Perler also considers Montaigne's recommendation of the emotion of compassion to his readers -- it was not discussed in his ancient sources but had occurred in Christian authors since Augustine and Gregory the Great. Aquinas regarded it as an aspect of mercy, the highest other-regarding virtue (Summa theologiae II-2, 30.4).

The chapters on Descartes and Spinoza address two early modern theories that employ the mechanistic causal models of the new physics. In Descartes, the science model is embedded in the ontological dualism between two kinds of created substances with different properties, material and mental, whereas Spinoza associated it with metaphysical substance monism. Perler begins his discussions of their theories of emotions with a detailed analysis of their ontological principles and some critical notes on other interpretations. Descartes famously argued for a link between the brain and the soul in the pineal gland and maintained that the mechanist neural and other physiological sequences of emotions are accompanied by conscious feeling states in the mind, which react to the changes in the nervous system and corresponding representations in various ways and incline the will this way or that. Even though emotions are not experienced as chosen states of the mind, they are not considered wholly alien because God has planned the neural reactions with respect to various perceptions as well as the corresponding emotions in a way that serves the life of embodied beings. The mutual influence between the physical and conscious orders led Descartes to regard the psychology of emotions in terms of a special functional union of the substances. While Scotus, Ockham and their followers continued to speak about the emotions of the intellectual soul and the sensory soul separately, this division disappears in Descartes since all emotions are thoughts excited in the mind without deliberation and will. Similarly, the hierarchy of the faculties of the soul is given up.

Cartesian emotions as positive or negative representations are experienced as moving drives, but the realization of their behavioral impulses can be prevented by the will. The will itself is an active power and free in the same way as in Scotus and Ockham. Apart from emotional behavior, the control of emotions and emotional habits is also possible with respect to the emotions themselves. Descartes considered the main problem with the emotions to be that in preceding critical thinking they often make small things seem too important and incline the will correspondingly, causing inner struggles, agitation, and temptation. His first advice for confronting disturbing emotional movements is traditional: one should distance oneself from emotional states and direct attention elsewhere by thinking of other things, but it is also possible to influence the neural mechanism by habituation to "re-wiring" the brain to another mental state. Before giving some examples of these procedures, Perler explains Descartes's idea of wonder as the basic emotion that alerts a person when a new pattern is imprinted in the brain and its relation to self-esteem and generosity as the basis of the active improvement of emotions.

The metaphysical framework of Spinoza's theory of emotions includes his substance monism with universal necessitarianism and determinism. Thought and extension are regarded as the two humanly understood attributes of the infinite unitary substance. Of the numerous modes of these attributes, the human body and its mental idea are the same thing but are expressed in two ways. Referring to this view, Perler explains that Spinoza's approach to emotions cannot be characterized as simply neurobiological or representational; they have both a physical structure and a mental structure that are parallel but not reducible to each other. An important factor is the conception of a striving (conatus) according to which everything strives to remain in its present state and, in body-mind unions, to increase their power of acting. Emotions are divided into passive and active. Passive emotions include confused evaluative representations of the physical states and their causes and active emotions include adequate representations. Active emotions are always positive because they are built on the basic emotions of desire and joy that increase the perception of vitality and physical power in accordance with Spinoza's metaphysical egoism. Passive emotions may also increase vitality but they are mostly negative, the basic negative emotion being sorrow, which disturbs the vitalizing power. In discussing the therapy of emotions, Spinoza mentions the traditional idea of redirecting one's attention, but he has other suggestions based on the idea of developing adequate thoughts about causes. The evaluation of Spinoza's proposals has divided the opinions of commentators, particularly the joyful acceptance of necessitarian metaphysics as a remedy for sorrow. Perler thinks that they make more sense than some people deem, provided that one agrees with Spinoza's naturalist determinism.

Many investigations about the theories of emotions in the above thinkers have appeared since Perler's 2011 book, but it is still the most extensive study of the metaphysical frameworks of these often overlooked theories. In the concluding chapter, Perler summarizes his discussion of the transformations of metaphysical conditions and underlines the importance of applying this kind of conceptual analysis to a variety of relevant theories from the past.  He stresses again that such an approach should be applied to contemporary views. Perler's well-informed historical analysis is very readable and reasonable, often illuminating and generally attractive, with many useful suggestions for further research.