Fellow Creatures: Our Obligations to the Other Animals

Placeholder book cover

Christine M. Korsgaard, Fellow Creatures: Our Obligations to the Other Animals, Oxford University Press, 2018, 252pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780198753858

Reviewed by Mark H. Bernstein, Purdue University


Christine Korsgaard has written an admirable book, accessible, cogently-argued, and thoughtful. She writes with bravery and humility, and perhaps most notably, with passion. It is evident that Korsgaard cares about the plight of animals, and yet the work is void of mawkish sentimentalism. All philosophers would benefit from a close reading; for any who are even remotely interested in animal ethics, reading Fellow Creatures is obligatory.

The monograph is a defense of the claim that "we human beings are obligated to treat all sentient animals, that is, all animals who have subjective experiences that are pleasant or painful, as what Kant called "ends-in-themselves", in at least one sense of that notion" (xi). That sense, as we subsequently learn, is the one in which being an 'end-in-itself' allows an individual to have moral claims on us; individuals who are 'ends-in-themselves' have goals and means of accomplishing such goals that obligate us to constrain how we humans can justifiably act toward them. In the last 40 years, many philosophers -- Singer, Regan, Rollin, Rowlands, Engels, and myself, among others -- would heartily agree with this sentiment although use different idioms to express it. Non-human sentient animals morally matter; their lives matter and their interests matter. This mattering of lives and interests is ultimately a function of the fact that their animal lives and interests matter to them. This is precisely why our lives and interests should matter to other human agents. Consistency, therefore, demands that we take animal lives and interests into account when we decide how to act. In this very significant way, they are we. Korsgaard's monograph can be read as a treatise on a Kantian attempt to demonstrate the truth of these claims. Since Kant himself explicitly denies that, in and of themselves, nonhuman (i.e., non-rational) animals are morally significant, she is swimming against the tide. She is an outstanding swimmer, one of the most worthy animal advocates in the last half-century.

Korsgaard begins by arguing for three theses. She argues that human beings are not more important than (non-human) animals, that some animals may be important to themselves with their own conscious existence being a great good for them, and that the pivotal difference, if any there be, between humans and animals resides in their distinct forms of cognition.

The claim regarding the comparative importance (value or good) is not so much false as 'almost' senseless. Since there is no neutral perspective from which such a judgment can be made, no ranking of importance is possible. And there is no neutral perspective because importance or value is a 'tethered' property: to be important is to be important to someone. With the impossibility of 'free-floating' importance, there can be no perspectiveless view from which such comparisons can be made.

Why then the qualification that such relative rankings of humans and animals are 'almost' senseless? Although we can't have meaningful comparative judgments sub specie aeternitatis, it is possible for humans and not animals (or vice versa) to have 'absolute importance'. Humans would be absolutely important if the good of humans is important for every creature who can have something or other be important to it; the good of humans would constitute part of the good of every individual who has a good. Effectively, the meaninglessness of an untethered importance is replaced by the ubiquity of a tethered importance. But, as Korsgaard points out, there is minimal plausibility of humans being absolutely important. Is it seriously possible to defend the idea that part of the good of a mountain goat is the human good or, equivalently, that it is valuable for goats that humans get what is good for themselves and avoid the things that are bad for themselves? If the claim for greater importance is really a claim about absolute importance, we retrieve intelligibility, but at too high a price.

The case for Korsgaard's second thesis starts with accepting -- as virtually a definitional point -- that animals are entities for whom things matter, or entities to whom things can be good or bad. The question is how to understand 'good' and 'bad' as applied to animal lives. There is a 'functional' sense of 'good' (or 'good-for', since necessarily, values are tethered) that applies to knives and animal lives. It is good-for a knife to be sharp because this property allows the knife to perform its function which is to cut. Animals' function is to continue functioning as a thing of its kind; they are 'designed' to keep on keeping on. To function well (and so be able to sustain themselves and reproduce), animals need to function well. If the pursued end is reached, the life of an animal is good-for her.

Animals, unlike knives, have goods in the 'final' sense as well. For animals, functional goods are final goods when they become the aim of actions. Animals, unlike knives, can have functional goods become final goods because they are selves -- the loci of conscious subjectivity. This subjective consciousness, or point of view, allows for interpreting the world in a 'valenced' way; only conscious animals see the world comprised of things that are good-for it (and so to be pursued) and bad-for it (and so to be avoided). These good things that are worth pursuing constitute the animal's final end, and since consciousness is absolutely essential to identifying (indeed, creating) these desirable ends, conscious experiences are of value to the animal self that has them. If we discover that plants or machines have the consciousness required for experiencing the world in a valenced way, then they too would be animals, and so be morally considerable.

Humans are different from animals because we can reflect upon our reasons for action, and act accordingly; we are 'rationally self-governed' creatures. In Kantian terms, we are autonomous; we can act under laws of which we are the source. Therefore, we alone can value our ends and determine whether they are worth pursuing; we can be governed by the 'right'. Compared to animals, we have an additional layer of well-functioning, for we alone can have ideals and values to live up to. Moreover, our capacity to use these ideals as guides to behavior makes us moral agents in a way that animals cannot be, and so we alone can be justifiably held morally responsible for our behavior. In the sense of an end-in-itself requiring 'rational self-government', Kant was correct in saying that only humans are ends-in-themselves. In the sense of 'end-in-itself' as a being that matters to itself and consequently can set moral constraints on our actions, Kant was mistaken.

Part 2 argues against the Kantian idea that we have only 'indirect' obligations to animals, i.e., obligations that are founded on the risk that bad behavior to animals may alter our character in ways that (negatively) affect our intra-human behavior. We ought not to hit a dog with a skillet, not because we have done anything wrong to the dog -- we cannot do anything wrong to dogs because they lack reason -- but because this act may negatively affect our character, resulting in more violent relations among ourselves. Korsgaard argues that here Kant misses the mark. Hitting the dog with a skillet is wrong because this action violates our obligation to the dog. There is something about the nature of dogs that grounds our obligations to them. This conclusion is virtually assured by the considerations adduced in Part 1. The novelty in Part 2 lies in showing that Kant had sufficient resources to arrive at the commonsense conclusion that we do have direct duties to some other animals; smashing a skillet over a dog's head -- absent some very strong countervailing reasons -- is morally objectionable in virtue of the kind of creatures dogs are.

How can such a Kantian argument be made? First, we recognize that Kant believes that valuing precedes value; items become valuable because some rational individual values them rather than conversely. But there are constraints on correct valuing; we must (correctly) value ourselves as ends-in-themselves in order for our valuing to be accurate. And we make this self-assessment on the basis that we naturally see what is good for us as absolutely good (good from all points of view and worthy of pursuit from all rational individuals). This is how creatures operate. We take our own worthy pursuits as making moral claims on other humans: others ought not to interfere with our pursuits as well as help us achieve them when the cost is sufficiently low.

While not sharing our rational nature, animals share our animal nature. They too have things that are good (and bad) for them, and, from their point of view, these items are absolutely important or good. As best they can, they pursue the goods and avoid the evils that nature has in store for them. Although incapable of reflecting upon and interrogating the worthiness of these pursuits, by virtue of participating in the same animal nature as us -- as beings who treat their own good as absolutely good -- we should value animals in the same way as we value ourselves; we should relate to them as they really are, viz., ends-in-themselves. Animals, just like humans, obligate us to perform, or not perform, certain types of action.

Part 3, the self-described "Consequences", is where Korsgaard deals with some of the thorniest practical questions asked of those who regard animals as end-in-themselves. Consider predation. Innocent antelope are being killed and eaten by innocent lions, both of whom are ends-in-themselves. What, if anything, should we do? Jeff McMahan has suggested that we might pursue the gradual extinction of carnivores or intervene genetically and gradually replace carnivores with herbivores, and so eventually eliminate the predator/prey relationship. And if we object that this would result in an unsustainable proliferation of herbivores perhaps, as Korsgaard offers as a friendly amendment, we can use our advanced genetic techniques to ensure that herbivores do not trample the environment that is necessary for them having good lives.

In a complex and fascinating argument, Korsgaard, while reporting that her conclusion at least in part surprises even herself, concludes that, pace McMahan, the phasing out of predators absorbs a similar problem that plagues gentrification (think  of SoHo and the Lower East Side of Manhattan). Just as we are wronging the community consisting of the original inhabitants and the original inhabitants themselves when gentrification occurs, phasing out predator animal communities and the individual predators who compose these communities, wrongs these communities and individuals that constitute them. Of particular interest, Korsgaard's argument is a fine example of how weaving relatively technical notions -- the 'replacement argument', the 'non-identity problem', and the viability of impersonal goods -- helps us understand the depth of an issue in animal ethics that has otherwise been unrecognized. Other practical issues are also sensitively discussed. We hear about the value of species, the ethics of animal experimentation, military use of animals, of course, eating animals.

I strongly recommend reading this book. You and, I hope, your fellow creatures, will be better off for it.