Feminism, Psychoanalysis, and Maternal Subjectivity

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Alison Stone, Feminism, Psychoanalysis, and Maternal Subjectivity, Routledge, 2012, 194pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415885423.

Reviewed by Ewa Plonowska Ziarek, University at Buffalo, The State University of New York


This book is a welcome and provocative contribution to feminist and psychoanalytical theories of motherhood and philosophical conceptions of subjectivity. There is little discussion of motherhood in psychoanalytic theory, where the main protagonist is the child and its difficult process of becoming a sexed speaking subject. With its presumption of universality, the philosophical conception of rational subjectivity not only marginalizes femininity but is in fact predicated upon the exclusion of body, affectivity, care, and relationality characteristic of maternal experience. Thus Stone rightly claims that the philosophical conception of subjectivity, action, and agency is at odds with motherhood, which, within these premises, would represent the loss of agency and the subsequent subservience of the self to the child's needs. Even in feminist theory there is a paucity of analyses of motherhood because of the lingering suspicions that even a critical focus on maternity might be complicit with the patriarchal heteronormative prescription in service of gender domination and at odds with the professional aspirations of women. As Stone puts it, Second Wave feminism is primarily a daughter's discourse. Thus, if motherhood represents a different kind of subjectivity, it is still an invisible subject, undertheorized and philosophically unaccounted for. Consequently, by providing a feminist articulation of maternal subjectivity, Stone's book represents an important intervention into all three of these disciplines: psychoanalysis, feminism, and philosophy.

The book repeats the Second Wave's distinction between femininity and motherhood, but this time in order to focus the discussion on the specificity, drama, and difficulties of maternal experience. It not only offers a feminist critique of the patriarchal, disciplinary regulation of motherhood and the gendered division of parenting labor, but, more importantly, proposes a feminist reformulation of maternal subjectivity, a new model of differentiation between the child and the maternal body, and, ultimately, a new conception of subjectivity.

Stone begins with a discussion of the painful experiential consequences of the inherited philosophical and political antithesis between autonomous subjectivity and motherhood for women who choose to have children. This difficulty is amplified by the patriarchal division of parenting labor, the lack of adequate childcare resources, and, I would add, the lack of accommodation of parenting reproductive labor within the paid workforce. Furthermore, the parenting industry focuses on the child's needs and well-being while relegating maternal desires, needs, and experiences to the background. Thus all too often motherhood for women represents the loss of agency and expression, as well as the difficulty of self- recognition.

Stone does not deny that women strive to make their experiences meaningful, but points to the cultural and political obstacles which hinder such an effort. Another difficulty, analyzed at length in chapter 2, lies in the cultural and psychoanalytical models of separation of the infant from the maternal body and the mother. As Luce Irigaray and Julia Kristeva point out in different ways, the dominant model of the child's separation is based on matricidal psychic violence. Stone compares Freud's and Lacan's psychoanalytic accounts of patricidal violence as the archaic origin of culture with feminist accounts (and critiques) of the matricidal violence underlying the trauma of castration. This matricidal model of the infant's separation from the maternal body is usually justified by the analysis of language, based as it is on the structural separations between the signifier, the signified, and the referent. For example, according to Kristeva, libidinal matricidal violence is the necessary correlative of infants' language acquisition and entry into the symbolic order. Of course, Kristeva points out that language binds this libidinal violence into the symbol of negation and enables the child's mediated relation to the mother as a separate subject, who instead of being a narcissistic receptacle of the child's fantasies becomes for her a distinct and separate object of desire.

While Stone acknowledges the necessity of differentiation from the maternal body for both the child and the mother, she argues that we need a new model of such differentiation. The model she proposes is based on embodied, affective and linguistic relationality, or connection, rather than on violence and a complete break from the maternal body. Stone makes a distinction between differentiation and separation: differentiation comprises both distancing and connection, while separation is based on break and discontinuity. Why is this new model of the infant's differentiation from the maternal body, we might ask, a crucial prerequisite of the new theory of maternal experience? Does it not repeat the traditional focus on the child rather than on the mother? The need for a new account of the mother/infant differentiation stems not only from feminist critiques of psychoanalysis and patriarchal culture, but also from Stone's claim that each experience of motherhood in fact repeats the mother's own infantile past and her own traumatic separation from the maternal body.

Stone provides such a model of mother/child differentiation in chapter 3, which for me is the most original and philosophically ambitious part of the book. She argues first of all against any false assumption of a symbiosis or fusion between the mother and the child, a fusion which would be broken by some third term, whether this term represents Kristeva's imaginary father, Lacan's symbolic Name of the Father, the object of maternal desire beyond the child, or language itself. Building on Irigaray's account of the biological and the symbolic mediating role of the placenta, Kristeva's notion of the maternal chora, Donald Winnicott's potential space, and Jessica Benjamin's primary relationality, Stone elaborates different forms of the mother/infant differentiation in the pre-Oedipal stage, which subsequently is expanded into (rather than interrupted by) language. Re-interpreted as a space of libidinal connection and differentiation, regulated through maternal bodily care, gestures, sounds, and movements, Kristeva's chora is for Stone always already a pre-linguistic "third" term mediating mother/infant relations. As she writes,

Processes unfold within the chora that produce the beginnings of a firmer differentiation between infant and mother. Regular rhythms of coming and going, weaning, feeding, toilet-training, and so on pattern the infant's biological affects and impulses in determinate ways. These patterns are full at once of affective charge and significance; they are a first level of acculturation imposed on the infant by 'archaic maternal authority'. (65-66)

The chora is subsequently transformed into what Winnicott describes as the potential space of play between the mother and the child, and is eventually sublated (though not without semiotic excess) into linguistic relations. This analysis of the semiotic chora as always already the third element between mother and child prevents the misinterpretation of the pre-Oedipal relations in terms of the fusion or the dyad, which then needs to be broken by the paternal third element.

Stone's interpretation of the chora as the spatiotemporal affective, libidinal mediation, as a kind of in-between third arising within the mother and child dyad makes a crucial contribution and an important intervention to feminist psychoanalysis and feminist philosophy alike, as it contests the usual interpretation of triangulation in terms of the Oedipal complex in its imaginary and symbolic (the Name of the Father) dimensions. It also raises a question for future feminist research whether the connection between language and symbolic paternity arises for historical rather than inherently structural reasons. I also appreciate Stone's emphasis on the structural openness of the chora onto increasingly complex linguistic and social relations. Despite the fact these linguistic and social networks distance the mother and the infant from the initial bodily intimacy, they never break this intimate bodily relationality, but expand it and elaborate it on increasingly complex levels.

Although I appreciate Stone's original rethinking of the pre-Oedipal model of mother/infant differentiation, I think her analysis could be further complicated by taking into account the infant's ambivalence, aggressivity, and loss. The questions of ambivalence and loss are addressed very well in chapters 4 and 5, but they are discussed as constitutive parts of the maternal experience and are not fully included in the analysis of the semiotic chora. Since she wants to avoid the matricidal model of language acquisition, which is for her, as it is for Irigaray, the counterpart of the castration trauma, Stone overemphasizes the "process of continuous, unbroken evolution, the evolution of maternal chora toward two differentiated selves" (73). I think that this evolutionary model of continuity is problematic as it downplays the complexity of loss, aggressivity, and ambivalence, all of which are discussed in the later parts of the book. Thus we might say that Stone's own account of differentiation is marked by ambivalence: when she speaks about maternal experience she is more than willing to acknowledge and analyze negativity and loss as constituent parts of that experience; yet when she speaks of the infant's differentiation from the maternal body she downplays such negativity and trauma in favor of the infant's continuous connection to the mother.

Since Stone argues that the drama of maternal experience includes unconscious and affective reenactment of the mother's own archaic past, chapter 5 is devoted to the unconscious dynamics of mothering a daughter and the daughter's ambivalence toward her mother: the ambivalence between love and hate, attachment and break from the maternal body. It is precisely such a robust analysis of ambivalence that should have been included as a crucial element of the semiotic chora from the start. Stone importantly claims that the maternal ambivalence toward a child does not have to be necessarily destructive because it can be transformed into a productive re-interpretation of the mother's own archaic past, and it can play an important role in expanding the semiotic/symbolic relations for the child into a more impersonal social network. The question that I would like to raise at this point, a question inspired by Kristeva's work, refers to the nature of this transformation of the semiotic into the symbolic and the social. For Kristeva as for Lacan such transformation involves the sublation of libidinal aggressivity into a linguistic symbol of negation. In general I find that Stone's own argument could be strengthened even further if she were to take into account the psychoanalytic theory of the drive and Kristeva's and Irigaray's theories of mediation. In particular, Irigaray's argument for a new modality of mediation, which would neither begin with the assumption of the archaic unity nor proceed as the work of death could be fruitfully transferred from the domain of sexual difference to Stone's analysis of maternal genealogy and the mother/child archaic relation.

In Stone's analysis, in addition to ambivalence, other important aspects of the drama of maternal experience are temporality and maternal loss. The question of time is already implicitly raised in the claim that maternal experience involves a repetition of the mother's own archaic relation to her mother. Stone further elaborates what kind of memory and repetition is involved here by drawing on, on the one hand, Freud's distinction between acting out, repeating, and working through, and, on the other hand, Kristeva's important essay, "Women's Time." Maternal temporality involves a repetition with a difference of the archaic past in a new context, provided by the mother's relations to her child. Although it might entail unconscious acting out, this repetition, Stone argues, is a form of emotional, affective, bodily memory, which is different from conscious memory mediated through language and visual perception. As she puts it, the time of the maternal experience is structured by the cyclical reappearance of the archaic past cutting through the linear unfolding of the present. In terms of Kristeva's own analysis in "Women's Time," we can call this temporal structure the future perfect. The temporality of the future perfect does not negate the futurity of maternal experience but prevents the equation of the future with the figure of the child, since the future perfect gives what I would call a new future to the maternal past. A new future for the past reveals a temporal structure of the transformative role of both the maternal ambivalence and the repetition of the maternal archaic past. It also names the temporal complexity of the maternal genealogy, which is not based on the unreflective reproduction of mothering, to use Nancy Chodorow's well-known term, but stresses instead loss, ambiguity, and transformation.

Another original aspect of Stone's book is her emphasis on the mourning and sorrow in maternal experience. Stone resists explaining maternal loss by the destructive historical effects of patriarchal politics alone, arguing instead that loss is inherent in the very structure of maternal experience. In fact it is a double loss: the loss of the affective intimacy with one's own mother and the loss of intimacy with the infant. These losses can be all the more devastating because they are not acknowledged by patriarchal culture as crucial elements of maternal experience -- all too frequently reduced to soap opera happiness -- or because they are pathologized as postpartum depression.

In order to provide a nuanced and complex account of maternal subjectivity, which is distinct from feminine subjectivity, Stone draws on different aspects of feminism (Chodorow), feminist psychoanalysis (Irigaray, Kristeva, Jessica Benjamin), object relations (Winnicott and, to a lesser degree, Melanie Klein), and feminist philosophy of the body, as well as poststructuralist critiques of subjective autonomy and rational agency. Her approach is an eclectic one, but, most of the time, it is a felicitous and critical eclecticism, which allows Stone to avoid orthodoxies and to develop her own original voice. If I were to offer my criticism of her methodology, I would point to the unresolved tension between feminist psychoanalysis and the empirical models of child development. As Stone admits, "I will bring together aspects of Kristeva and Winnicott, of Irigaray and Chodorow, and of empirical theorists of infant and child development such as Daniel Stern and Margaret Mahler" (31). I am not against empirical analysis per se, but most of the time in Stone's own work the empirical theorists often provide developmental models, which are at odds with the best psychoanalytic insights she deploys. As I have already mentioned, I would also like to see more engagement in Stone's work with such psychoanalytic notions as drive, aggressivity, desire, and trauma, all of which surely play a role in the drama of maternal experience. For example, the specificity of the maternal desire for the child is not addressed as if the author feels more comfortable discussing maternal needs or desires beyond the child.

My most substantial criticism concerns Stone's treatment of the drive and language. So crucial to Kristeva's notion of the semiotic, the question of the drive is most of the time reduced by Stone to biological "energy" or affect, and yet these are only two aspects of the drive, which cannot be reduced to " raw" energy, because the drive, in contrast to biological instinct, arises on the border between soma and psyche, nature and culture. For example, Stone writes the following about the drive:

I am not convinced that quanta of energy literally pass between the bodies of mother and infant . . . I find it more plausible that mother and child primarily exchange actions, gestures, expressions and movements . . . in an immediate, spontaneously mimetic way (74).

Yet to reduce the drive to the literal quantum of energy is to disregard the libidinal aspects of psychoanalysis and to forget about the vicissitudes of the drives, one of which is sublimation, which ought to play a role in Stone's theory of differentiation. Similarly, the question of language would require a more detailed analysis if the author were to provide an alternative relationship between the semiotic and the symbolic. Surprisingly, the section devoted to language is one of the shortest in the entire book -- it is just a two-page section of the otherwise very exciting third chapter. In her analysis of language Stone focuses on Laplanche's notion of the linguistic and extra-linguistic message addressed to the child by the parents. Although the insight that the infant acquires language by being called by the parents, and primarily by the mother, shows that our primary position in language is that of the addressee rather than of the autonomous, separate speaker, the notion of the message and the address already presupposes differentiation as well as, to a certain degree, separation between the speakers. So I disagree with Stone that the notion of the message necessarily indicates that "the position of the speaker embodies a psychic structure of continuous connection with, not separation from, the mother" (79). This thesis requires a much longer argument. To be sure, the position of the addressee who might not understand the message is not that of the autonomous "matricidal speaking position" (79); but from this premise it does not follow that the infant as an addressee "embodies a psychic structure of continuous connection with . . .  the mother." For example, the infant as the addressee might respond with frustration, aggression, or rejection to the maternal message, just as she might respond with affection and love.

Nonetheless, despite these methodological disagreements, I find Stone's analysis of the historical, political and psychic complexity of maternal experience to be a crucial and illuminating contribution to one of the most neglected areas of feminist psychoanalysis, and feminist philosophy more generally. The discussions of the semiotic chora as the always already mediating element between the mother and the child, of the maternal ambivalence and loss, as well as of the structures of repetition especially constitute the thought-provoking and innovative aspects of the book. Furthermore, Stone skillfully negotiates the methodological rift between the historicism of political critique and the ahistoricism of structural psychoanalysis. Stone's analysis of the temporality of maternal experience and genealogy are especially salutary in this respect. The book should be of great interest not only to feminist psychoanalysis but also to anyone concerned with the affective, embodied, and relational models of subjectivity.