Feminism, Sexuality and the Return of Religion

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Linda Martín Alcoff and John Caputo (eds.), Feminism, Sexuality and the Return of Religion, Indiana University Press, 2011, 194pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780253223043.

Reviewed by Ellen T. Armour, Vanderbilt Divinity School


In 1997, John Caputo launched a series of conferences on religion and postmodernism, first at Villanova University then at his first post-retirement institutional home, Syracuse University. Feminism, Sexuality, and the Return of the Religious is the latest of the volumes of these conference proceedings published by Indiana University Press. Co-edited by Caputo and the distinguished feminist philosopher Linda Martín Alcoff, this volume follows its predecessors in bringing together a number of distinguished scholars from a variety of disciplines to reflect on a topic salient to both the academy and the wider culture. While the preceding volumes have typically included at least one feminist perspective on the issue at hand, this is the first to focus on feminism (and on sexuality). The predominance of scholars in religious studies in the volume also distinguishes it from its predecessors. They bring to bear their expertise in a number of subfields in religious studies including anthropology (Saba Mahmood), historical/theological studies (Mark Jordan), and feminist and womanist theology (Sarah Coakley, Kelly Brown Douglas, Catherine Keller). Deeply conversant in the philosophical and theoretical literature that constitute the intellectual backdrop of this series of conferences, these scholars engage with feminist and queer theory, critical race theory, literary studies, process thought, as well as contemporary continental philosophy, as appropriate.

This particular convergence of scholarly expertise and framing question makes the volume a signal contribution to the burgeoning (if rather provincial, to my mind) discourse on the so-called return of religion. In his remarks that open the roundtable discussion at the volume's end, Caputo identifies two markers of religion's return: the recently ascendant political power of conservative Christianity in the U.S. and the newfound interest in religion -- primarily Christianity -- among literary scholars and philosophers, particularly in Europe. "If modernization has meant secularization, the word postmodern, if it means anything, inevitably means 'post-secular," he says (160). As we'll see, the volume poses important challenges to this framework; indeed, to the concept of a return per se.

A signal contribution of these conferences has been the importation of prominent European philosophers and theorists with interests in religion as keynote speakers. Fulfilling this role here are the Italian philosopher, Gianni Vattimo, and the French literary and cultural theorist Hélène Cixous. Vattimo argues in fairly brief compass that the Vatican's single-minded endorsement of marital reproductive heterosexuality grounded in "nature" pits the Church against modern science. Religion's return figures here as a nefarious recapitulation of the Church's stubborn and dogmatic rejection of Galileo and Copernicus; a return quite at odds with the forms of faith that Vattimo argues are possible after modernity's demise.

Where Vattimo's contribution is more suggestive than substantial, Cixous' essay, "Promised Belief," is both. She takes up the question of belief, but in a performative rather than discursive vein and in the intellectually rich and deeply personal context of her long friendship with Jacques Derrida, who died in 2004. Within the complex texture of their relationship, belief figured as something she supposedly had that he did not, but that he wanted -- or at least wanted her to have, for his sake as much as her own. But belief in what, you might ask? That is never made clear -- or at least, not to this reader -- and deliberately so, I think. The absence of a definite object signals the essay's particular contribution, as I see it, to the question of religion's return (which sometimes figures as belief's epistemological legitimization). While belief certainly appears here in the company of other religious themes, it does not operate as their epistemological ground. Indeed what matters about belief -- here, at least -- is not its object or the validity of its truth claims, but the effects of its circulation between, around, and beyond Derrida and Cixous. What would the discourse of religion's return look like if it took into itself this portrait of belief and its import?

The contributions by scholars of religion to Feminism, Sexuality, and the Return of the Religious go yet more deeply into the overlapping terrain the title marks out. Jordan and Brown Douglas, for example, consider critical dimensions of Christianity's troubles with sexuality. Jordan, a preeminent scholar in queer Christian studies, offers a cogent, incisive and critical analysis of religion's purported return considered through the lens of current Christian speech about sexuality -- especially queer sexuality. That we find such strident condemnations of queer sexuality coupled with bellicose affirmations of marital heterosexuality coming out of the mouths of Christian spokespersons reflects Christianity's capitulation to the secular gods of modern (commodified, contained, controlled) sexuality, Jordan argues. This calls into question Christianity's return in (at least) two ways. First, insofar as the modern secular discourse of sex is the scion of its medieval Christian predecessor (for all their differences, beneath the figure of the modern homosexual lies the medieval sodomite, as Jordan has shown elsewhere), the line between the secular and the religious presupposed by "return" erodes. Second, this capitulation belies the full complexity of Christian speech --- and silence -- around sex. As Jordan has shown elsewhere, Christianity long preferred celibacy over and even in marriage, for example. It also (unintentionally) enabled and ultimately sought to constrain what we have come to call "mysticism," arguably a form of Christian eroticism. Such occlusions simultaneously close off and evoke hopes for a "return" of a queerer Christian sort.

Similarly, Brown Douglas reads the question of religion's purported return through the attempt by African American churches and communities to combat associations of blackness with sexual abnormality through enforcing "hyper-proper sexuality" (110). On the one hand, Brown Douglas diagnoses this as an unfortunate capitulation to the modern sexual regime, which figured black men and women as hypersexual and thus objects of fear, fascination, and particularly exploitation. Embedded in this capitulation is a recapitulation of what she calls "Platonized Christianity;" that is, a form of Christianity that severs body from soul, the sexual from the sacred. Present from Christianity's inception, Platonized Christianity found a comfortable home, she argues, in the white protestant evangelical traditions formative of black church traditions and, through that institution, the views of the black community. She draws on Ann Petry's novel, The Street, in part to illuminate the price exacted from black women, in particular, by this (re)capitulation. But The Street also opens onto an important countercurrent in black cultural life, the blues. Though often castigated by black Christianity as the devil's music because of its sexually explicit lyrics and sensual musicality, these very features, Brown Douglas argues, render the blues a vehicle for the sacred, particularly for a religious tradition that is founded in the claim that God became flesh.

Like Jordan and Brown Douglas, feminist theologians Keller and Coakley continue to pursue issues of longstanding interest to them and to their readers. Keller considers the prospect of religion's return under the rubric of "returning God." To what extent and how is feminist theology positioned in contemporary God-talk; a discourse bounded on one end by its engagement with the death of God theologies of the 1980's (Thomas J.J. Altizer, etc.) and by the global resurgence of mostly patriarchal forms of religion? As an alternative to the specter of a (resurrected) "good old God" -- whether God the Father or "Yahweh in a skirt" (Nelle Morton) -- Keller draws on strands in continental thought, in queer and feminist theology and theory, and in Christian mystical traditions to imagine a return of an altogether otherwise God; a God figured as manifold, with multiple becomings, in-carnations.

Coakley's essay is a provocative meditation on the gendered dynamics of sacrifice, subjection and submission in Christianity -- here considered through the akedah (the near-sacrifice of Isaac in Genesis 19:1-22). In what she terms a "feminist midrash," Coakley pursues the possibilities for disrupting sacrifice-as-usual (in the service of patriarchy) that the story offers.  These center around Isaac. He enters the story as powerless would-be-sacrifice from patriarch to Patriarch (at the latter's command); a position all too often associated with femininity. But he emerges from the story unscathed and utterly transformed on Coakley's reading; a position achieved not through the assertion of his own agency but through "divine interruption" (18) of the very logic that the story seems to instantiate. What happens, then, when we reverse the analogy between Isaac and femininity; when we read the akedah as femininity's near-sacrifice? Claiming and exercising agency in feminine form may seem the way out of patriarchy's binds, but true freedom may require instead submission to a theo-logical sacrifice of those very logics themselves, Coakley suggests.

Saba Mahmood places front and center the provincialism of the discourse of religion's return -- and the high stakes inherent in it. On the one hand, the notion of the return of religion has little purchase on what we call "the Muslim world" as experienced and constituted by its native inhabitants. Yet, the trope profoundly distorts American perceptions of that world (and its inhabitants). Islam is taken to exemplify the religion that secularism sought to banish; a backward thinking source of social ills that the enlightened see (rightly) as mere illusion masquerading as power play. The wars in Iraq and Afghanistan are justified as offering enlightenment and emancipation to the Muslim world, a project figured primarily in and as the liberation of the (veiled) Muslim woman from religiously justified oppression. (The popularity of memoirs by and/or about Muslim women such as Reading Lolita in Tehran exhibits the power and prevalence of this [mis]perception and Americans' investment in it.) The actual interplay of religion, freedom, and oppression in the countries and cultures lumped together as "the Muslim world" belies this simplistic overlay on a number of levels, Mahmood argues. For one thing, Islam, like all religions, is internally multiple and diverse; some forms of it exhibit a gendered logic and practice quite opposite to that of, say, the Taliban. Reprising only briefly her account of the Egyptian women's mosque movement in The Politics of Piety: The Islamic Revival and the Feminist Subject (Princeton, 2005; recently reprinted with a new preface by the author), she notes that, even in so-called "conservative" forms of Islam, religious devotion often works for rather than against Muslim women's agency in and through their self-subjection to its norms.

Feminism, Sexuality, and the Return of Religion is more than simply the sum of its parts. Taken together -- particularly as framed by the editors' introduction and the concluding roundtable -- the essays intervene in intellectually and politically significant ways in an important scene of contemporary philosophical and religious thought. Readers unfamiliar with that scene may find the reading difficult going, but those who persist will be well rewarded for their efforts.