Feminist Epistemology and American Pragmatism: Dewey and Quine

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Alexandra L. Shuford, Feminist Epistemology and American Pragmatism: Dewey and Quine, Continuum, 2010, 176pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826498670.

Reviewed by Sharyn Clough, Oregon State University


Feminist Epistemology and American Pragmatism: Dewey and Quine by Alexandra Shuford is the third in a recent series of books from Continuum that will be of interest to those following debates within feminist epistemology and philosophy of science (the other two books are Rationality and Feminist Philosophy by Deborah K. Heikes, reviewed earlier this year in NDPR, and Objectivity in the Feminist Philosophy of Science by Karen Cordrick Haely). Each of these three books is authored by philosophers new to these debates, consistent with Continuum's mission to "actively seek out the emerging generation." These slim volumes are not inexpensive ($120.00 each and not available in paperback), but each contains something of value.

The strength of Shuford's presentation is her application of Dewey's theory of inquiry to the problem of the high rate of caesarean sections in US hospitals. This latter problem is serious and Shuford's analysis is a welcome addition to feminist attempts to address it. This key chapter, "Feminist Pragmatist Inquiry," is the last of six that also include "Birthing Feminist Pragmatist Epistemologies," "Quine's Naturalized Epistemology," "Antony's Analytic Feminist Empiricism," "Nelson's Holistic Feminist Empiricism," and "Dewey's Theory of Inquiry."

Shuford's main thesis is that Nelson and Antony's feminist use of Quine, though in the right pragmatist spirit, still fails to acknowledge fully the embodied nature of knowing that is captured by Dewey and is necessary for understanding and criticizing phenomena such as the over-use of caesarean sections in the US. That feminist empiricist accounts are not attentive enough to issues of embodiment is an important point, echoed by Kristen Intemann in her recent Hypatia essay "25 Years of Feminist Empiricism and Standpoint Theory: Where Are We Now?" However, as I discuss below, I would rather that Shuford focused more on her positive project with Dewey and less on what seem, in the main, like warmed over and inadequate sketches of Cartesian epistemology and feminist rejections of it. Her discussion of Nelson's (1990) and Antony's (1993) feminist use of Quine is more original, but uncontextualized vis-à-vis more recent debates, and in any event not obviously necessary for making her points about Dewey as applied to the growing problem of caesarean sections.

In Chapter 1, "Birthing Feminist Pragmatist Epistemologies," Shuford begins with a by now familiar refrain: traditional "s knows that P" models are inadequate (see Lorraine Code), knowers are embodied, and this matters. This overview continues in her second chapter, where Shuford presents "A Brief History of Objectivity in Western Philosophy." It is all Descartes' fault (see Susan Bordo). Perhaps I am sensitive to the rehashed feeling of this material because it is so close to my own introductory and admittedly overly simple treatment of it in the first two chapters of my Beyond Epistemology: A Pragmatist Approach to Feminist Science Studies -- a book nowhere mentioned, even critically, by Shuford. In fact, Shuford does not mention, let alone engage, any feminist discussions of Quine, Davidson, Rorty, or other contemporary pragmatists published later than Nelson's 1990 book and Antony's 1993 essay. This despite the more recent revisiting of these discussions in Nelson's 2003 collection Feminist Interpretations of Quine and her 2004 Hypatia Special Issue on feminism and naturalism, co-edited with Alison Wylie, which contains a number of essays addressing Quine and Davidson.

Once Shuford moves to her discussion of Quine's naturalized epistemology, especially Quine's argument in "Two Dogmas," things pick up considerably. "Two Dogmas" is an essay every philosopher claims to know, sort of; but I'm going to go out on a limb and bet that only a much smaller subset of these have read through it carefully and/or really understand it. I used to. I think. I blame problems in comprehension on Quine's engagement with Kant, but Shuford walks her reader carefully through this material, which is very much appreciated. Her discussion of his holism and the metaphor of the web of belief is similarly well-executed.

One concern in her presentation of Quine arises when Shuford describes Quine as an uncritical proponent of conceptual schemes (e.g., p. 25). The relativism that arises from this acceptance has been well-discussed in the feminist and other analytic literature, e.g., Davidson's "On the Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme," (Davidson [1974] 1984) though Shuford does not mention this discussion. The usual route for saving Quine from relativism is to argue that he rejects the notion of conceptual schemes (this is a route that Nelson takes). Shuford, however, embraces Quinean relativism and considers it a strength. She argues that by acknowledging the conceptual schemes that organize our evidential analyses, i.e., the schemes to which every evidential analysis is relative, we can better articulate "the role of historical and social context" that operate in the context of discovery (p. 46). I have argued (Clough 2004) that this sort of Quinean relativism is a wrong-headed approach for feminist epistemologists who properly want to acknowledge the role of historical and social context in knowledge production. It robs us of the prescriptive force we need as feminists. My concern here makes for a good lead in to Shuford's discussion of Antony's 1993 essay "Quine as Feminist," where Shuford is critical of Antony's attempts to address Quinean relativism.

According to Shuford, Antony's analysis of Quine gives us the tools we need to solve what Antony has called the "bias paradox" -- that is, the problem of differentiating epistemically negative biases (say sexism) from epistemically positive biases (say feminism). However, says Shuford, Antony solves the paradox only by reconceiving Quine's relativism and introducing to his work, instead, a "modest realism" (p. 55). I think that solving the bias paradox is crucial for feminists, but if we need to so radically reconceive Quine in order to reach a solution, then this is a good reason to reject Quine. As I mentioned, Shuford thinks that Quine's relativism is a strength and so rejects not Quine, but Antony's realist re-interpretation of Quine. But why then introduce Antony's essay at all? Shuford wants to get us to Dewey, and I am not sure how this discussion helps us reach her goal.

However, there is still one more chapter before Dewey is introduced and that is the chapter devoted to Nelson's book on Quine (Nelson 1990). Here, Shuford makes the controversial point that, unlike Antony, Nelson embraces a certain amount of relativism in her use of Quine, namely in Nelson's acceptance of Quinean conceptual schemes that are consistent with, and evidence of, Nelson's support of postmodern and feminist standpoint epistemology (p. 64). This is a particularly unusual reading of Nelson and needs to be more responsible to more recent work by Nelson, where her rejection of various postmodern accounts of evidence is fairly clear (even as early as, e.g., Nelson 1993). At the end of this chapter, as with her discussion of Antony, Shuford tempers her initial enthusiasm with a cautionary note, in this case that Nelson "overlooks the embodied aspects of human existence" (p. 86).

In the penultimate chapter, Dewey's theory of inquiry is presented. This discussion is good and very persuasive. Shuford references other feminist presentations of classical pragmatism by Charlotte Haddock Siegfried, Lisa Heldke, and Shannon Sullivan and makes good use of Dewey's notion of "habit." She concludes: "Dewey's theory of inquiry establishes a link between knowledge and the necessity of human embodiment … and provides a way of understanding how gender differences among bodies enter into knowledge processes" (p. 112). She then aims to augment Dewey's inquiry to produce a "Dewey-Nelson hybrid epistemology" (p. 113). Perhaps because I am not compelled by her interpretations of Quine or Nelson, I am unclear on what she hopes to get by augmenting Dewey in this way. It would seem that adding to Dewey some feminist details about embodiment would give Shuford the same effect, without tying her to a particular (and problematic) reading of Nelson and/or Quine.

In the final chapter, Shuford makes use of Dewey's embodied notions of habit to support midwifery as against the medicalization of childbirth, particularly the medicalization that contributes to the alarmingly high rates of caesarean sections in US hospitals. The prescriptive features of Dewey's epistemology support midwifery in terms of "bodily habits" concerning "time, technology, and touch" (p. 122). Shuford makes a compelling argument that on each of these matrices, traditional midwifery is an improvement over standard hospital practice and makes for better birth outcomes for both mothers and babies.

I hope that Shuford continues this discussion (and in more accessible venues). It is becoming an increasingly important part of debates about healthcare in the US context, and Shuford has particular and valuable skills to bring to the table.


Antony, Louise. 1993. "Quine as feminist: The radical import of naturalized epistemology." In A mind of one's own: Feminist essays on reason and objectivity, eds. Louise Antony and Charlotte Witt. Westview Press.

Clough, Sharyn. 2003. Beyond epistemology: A pragmatist approach to feminist science studies. Rowman and Littlefield.

Clough, Sharyn. 2004. "Having it all: Naturalized normativity in feminist science studies." Hypatia: A Journal of Feminist Philosophy 19(1): 102-118.

Davidson, Donald. [1974] 1984. "On the very idea of a conceptual scheme." Reprinted in Inquiries into truth and interpretation. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Intemann, Kristen. 2010. "25 years of feminist empiricism and standpoint theory: Where are we now?" Hypatia: A Journal of Feminist Philosophy 24(4): 778-796.

Nelson, Lynn Hankinson. 1990. Who Knows? From Quine to a feminist empiricism. Philadelphia: Temple University Press.

Nelson, Lynn Hankinson. 1993. "A Question of Evidence." Hypatia: A Journal of Feminist Philosophy 8(2): 172-89.

Nelson, Lynn Hankinson and Jack Nelson, eds. 2003. Feminist Interpretations of Quine. Pennsylvania State Press.

Nelson, Lynn Hankinson and Alison Wylie, eds., 2004. Feminist Science Studies, a special issue of Hypatia: A Journal of Feminist Philosophy 19(1).