Feminist Experiences: Foucauldian and Phenomenological Investigations

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Johanna Oksala, Feminist Experiences: Foucauldian and Phenomenological Investigations, Northwestern University Press, 2016, 189pp., $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810132405.

Reviewed by  Ladelle McWhorter, University of Richmond


This book has the clarity of style and the systematic and careful scholarship that readers have come to expect from Johanna Oksala. It also has remarkable breadth, engaging a wide range of feminist, phenomenological, and post-structuralist texts and weaving disparate ideas together in new and illuminating ways.

The book's general thesis is that feminist theory needs to be phenomenological -- that is, it needs to address and build upon experience but also to take a transcendental perspective on that experience. Oksala is, of course, quite aware of feminist critiques of both these claims. She describes the ways in which early Second Wave feminists used personal experience aggregated and analyzed through Consciousness Raising practices to produce their theories and politics ("the personal is political") and the subsequent feminist discussions of the limitations of reliance upon personal experience -- which was too often the aggregated experiences of similarly raced, abled, educated, and economically and nationally situated women -- as the primary basis for theoretical claims. Because, they realized, experience is always already structured by the very social forms and practices that they wanted to critique, later Second Wave feminists began to turn their attention to the ways in which subjects are constructed in discourse, and by the last decade of the twentieth century, experience was repudiated as a source of evidence in feminist social theories. Transcendental analysis also fell victim to feminist critique, and for some of the same reasons. There is no universal transcendental ego or transcendentally necessary conditions for the possibility of knowledge, feminists claimed. Or at least such a perspective can never be attained by flesh and blood human beings

Unlike some of the theorists she considers, Oksala does not attempt to rehabilitate personal experience by rejecting the idea that subjects are constructed in discourse. She embraces Michel Foucault's work on that issue and does a nice job of explicating and defending his position, which is hers as well. She shows how experience can be useful, despite its embeddedness in networks of power, in combination with a genealogical methodology that locates the emergence of meanings and subjects in discursive practices -- with a heavy emphasis on the word practices. Language does not materially produce things or human beings, she insists, but discursive practices do shape and will always shape who we are and how we understand ourselves and the world we live in. Oksala thus rejects the dichotomy of language versus experience that she sees functioning in feminist theoretical debates; language and experience are imbricated, she maintains, and we must draw on such imbricated phenomena to formulate our theory.

Oksala's claim that feminist theory needs to take a transcendental perspective is a bit more questionable, in my view, although given her definition of the term we might be willing to grant her point. She rejects the Husserlian transcendental ego in accordance with feminist theorists' rejection of a disembodied and non-located perspective as well as of universal experience and meaning; hence her acknowledgement that the phenomenology she advocates "might not be recognizable as phenomenology" (p. 13). We must let go of the notion of a complete transcendental reduction, she states; however, Oksala reminds her readers, an older and more useful meaning of the transcendental is to be found in Kant's work, where it simply refers to the necessary conditions for the possibility of experience. Oksala's preferred version of the transcendental is a modified Kantian conception; feminist theorists, she asserts, must uncover the historical conditions for the possibility of their or our experience, socially located and temporally indexed, not the necessary conditions for the possibility of knowledge or experience universally. Experience alone is unreliable, just as feminist critics of consciousness raising as a single foundation for theory have said; but experience is an important source of evidence for the historical structures that generate it. True, these structures are not transcendentally necessary, as Kant would have it, but they do transcend the specific content of the experiences that any of us have. Therefore, our genealogical and sociological and historical efforts to uncover those structures can be called transcendental. In this sense, she says, Foucault's genealogical work is transcendental; his aim is to produce an historical ontology of ourselves, not just describe our experience, and feminists should endeavor to do likewise.

Oksala, as usual, does a good job of explaining and arguing for this point. Nonetheless, I question the need for such an effort to retain a term like this, one with so much history that runs counter to the direction that she wants to take feminist thought. It seems to me that her claim that language and experience are imbricated, not opposed, is enough to rescue the project of studying experience, and the separation of the empirical and transcendental, as her resuscitation of the latter word suggests, runs an unnecessary risk.

Oksala identifies and addresses several points of possible critique along the way. Among them is the notion that it is possible to read Foucault's work as something akin to Thomas Kuhn's or to Donald Davidson's -- that is, to read his notion of historical conditions for subjectivity and knowledge as something like a prevailing conceptual scheme -- and of course doing so could leave his account with no latitude for thought-induced change. Yet historically concepts and conceptual schemas do change, as Foucault's and Kuhn's own work make obvious, and in some instances Foucault at least suggests that change can be actively sought and shaped. But the question is how that could be possible if we are trapped in a conceptual scheme. Feminists, intent upon social change, are understandably less than eager to accept any analysis that leaves us at the mercy of irrational forces or trapped in social stasis.

Oksala tackles this criticism head-on. There is a world, after all, to which we are open; experience can exceed our historically generated categories and can distance us from some of them enough to enable creative reformulations. Oksala insists on this openness, but she stops short of affirming the presence of raw sensation. As a result, she walks a philosophical tightrope. Her balancing pole is a controversial claim: no experience is non-conceptual, she maintains. In chapter two, she turns to the work of John McDowell (1994, Mind and World) to make an argument that experience is always already conceptual even while it involves direct encounters with material being. I found McDowell's account, as presented in Oksala's book, opaque, and thus I found this part of her argument to be the weakest in the book. Perhaps a little more detail would have persuaded me, but I was left with the thought that surely there are other ways to understand how language and sensuous or emotional experience are imbricated without insisting that all experience is conceptual. I also found myself wondering whether McDowell, and by extension Oksala, wanted to say other animals also have conceptual experience. For unless experience is to be defined in such a way that it becomes impossible for non-humans to have, it seems to me that McDowell would need to say that any being that responds to environmental stimuli in a purposeful way is having conceptual experience. And at that point I no longer know what conceptual means.

These issues aside, Oksala's program for feminist theory is intriguing, and she makes a strong case that in the last decades of the twentieth century and the first decades of our own, women in the West have become neoliberal subjects; Western women are no longer the sort of self-sacrificial subjects that mid-twentieth-century standards of femininity required and that Second Wave feminism tried to understand and liberate. Feminists must mark and study the effects of this change in our conditions of existence. Consequently, it is even more imperative to investigate the ways in which experience is politically structured, even while drawing on our experience to do our theoretical work.

In the final chapter, Oksala calls for "a feminist politics of inheritance" (pp. 145ff). The phrase captures her insistence that historical conditions form but do not determine our identities and the content of our knowledges. We are who we are and we know what we know -- and do not know -- on the basis of what we have inherited from the cultural and political situations into which we were born and socialized. We respond to the world and to each other on the basis of those situations. But we must also respond to those situations by estranging ourselves from them as much as we can in order to critique them, always immanently yet always open to their excess. And thus, she holds, we have a kind of responsibility to our inheritances. There is no universal Woman that holds us together in our political work, and attempts to find such a universal are not only doomed to failure but are also exclusionary and often oppressive in their failure. Nor can we pull ourselves together under the banner of sexism, which would serve only to define our politics as a kind of ressentiment, an affirmation, however indirect, of ourselves as primarily those who suffer. Instead, what binds us -- not universally, but historically and pluralistically -- is our heritage. We must affirm both the suffering and the joys and triumphs that form our heritage(s) and build our political movement(s) upon that basis, always open to whatever in our ongoing experiences exceeds it.

One might wish that Oksala had developed this final chapter at greater length, perhaps rather than spending so much space and effort defending her notions of phenomenology and transcendentality and arguing for the imbrication of language and experience on the basis of the always already conceptual. Her view that the feminist debates over the status of experience at the end of the twentieth century were deadlocked and unfruitful seems right, and her critique of that deadlock seems right as well. She has cleared the ground in the first chapters of Feminist Experiences. One can hope that she will go on in a subsequent monograph to flesh out the notion of a feminist politics of inheritance in much greater detail, leaving the twentieth century behind. No doubt she has much to contribute to the feminist theory of the twenty-first.