Feminist Interpretations of Augustine

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Judith Chelius Stark (ed.), Feminist Interpretations of Augustine, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2007, 326pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780271032580.

Reviewed by Colleen McCluskey, Saint Louis University


As one might suspect from the title, this book is a collection of essays critiquing the work of an important medieval thinker from a feminist perspective.  Thus, its immediate audience will surely be feminists who have an interest in the history of medieval philosophy or theology.  Nevertheless, I would argue that this book has relevance for a much broader audience.  If we acknowledge the surely uncontroversial presupposition that the Western intellectual tradition continues to influence the social, cultural, political, economic, educational, and intellectual institutions in our society in ways that are not fully understood and therefore not always acknowledged, then a book that explicitly examines the thought of such an important foundational figure within that tradition is relevant to anyone who cherishes the tradition and who is interested in understanding how it continues to operate in our own time.  This book, I would argue, makes a valuable contribution to that project.

The eleven essays and one poem are composed by authors with expertise from a diversity of fields within the humanities.  It is not surprising that several are theologians or members of religious studies departments while others are philosophers.  One is a church historian and another, a psychotherapist in private practice.  Three authors hold endowed chairs at their institutions.  Thus, the essays exhibit a number of different approaches to the subject matter.  The papers demonstrate a thorough and impressive familiarity with the appropriate literature and often raise interesting, original, and (in my view) persuasive points.  Since I do not have the space to discuss all of them, I will limit my remarks to those I regard as the strongest papers and one essay about which I have some reservations.

I suppose that for scholars who have at least a passing familiarity with Augustine's works, the most obvious starting point for an explicitly feminist examination of his corpus is his relationships with women, and in particular, his relationship with his mother, Monica (or Monnica, the traditional African, pre-Roman spelling), and with his African partner with whom he lived for some fifteen years (and with whom he had a child) before dismissing her in light of his social ambitions.  The basic details of these relationships are well known from Augustine's most famous work, Confessions, and scholarship on them is abundant, especially on his relationship with Monica.  Several of the essays in this book focus explicitly on these relationships, and other essays bring details of them into their discussions in the service of different points.  One might think that such territory is well-worn.  But one of the most striking essays in the collection, written by Margaret R. Miles, focuses upon Augustine's partner, not primarily from Augustine's view, as is more typical, but upon what we can know about the woman herself, this unnamed, but not nameless woman (Miles' distinction).  Since Augustine tells us little about her, and then only from his own perspective and for his own purposes, this is no easy task, as there appears to be no other source of information about her.  As Miles notes, Augustine mentions his partner in order to serve his own purposes in describing his long journey toward sexual continence and celibacy, and what attention historians have traditionally given her has been in the service of a better understanding of Augustine (p. 168).  Miles attempts to understand her on her own terms.  She admits that she cannot give us a deep portrait of this woman, since such a reconstruction must be based upon mere glimpses within Augustine's text.  Rather, Miles argues that we can construct something of a picture of her by considering Augustine's few remarks within the context of the social and historical conditions under which she lived her life.  The result is one of the most interesting articles in the collection, furthering our understanding of the ways in which women operated within (and challenged) their social conditions in late Roman antiquity.

Overall, the focus of this book is broader than what we can learn by looking at Augustine's relationships with his mother and his partner, as important as those relationships might be.  Two essays discuss what we can ascertain about Augustine's views on women from a less studied source: his letters (McWilliam, Matter).  These essays provide evidence that despite Augustine's pessimistic views of the rational and moral capabilities of women expressed in his more public writings, he held individual women in high regard.  Other papers draw upon his writings on marriage and virginity to explore the ways in which Augustine both was a product of his times and helped to reinforce and sustain the subordinate status of women (e.g., Ruether).  Another important text with far reaching implications for the social treatment of women is book 12 of De Trinitate, where Augustine discusses the important notion of imago dei, which, within this tradition, grounds a kind of dignity and special status for human beings, and which, Judith Stark argues, could have been mined by Augustine to develop a more egalitarian account of human nature and thereby to challenge the entrenched patriarchal system of his time.

Stark presents Augustine's argument that human beings are created in the image and likeness of God in virtue of those capacities that differentiate them from other creatures, i.e., those found in the mind.  Augustine divides the mind into higher reason, which contemplates the immaterial eternal truths, and lower reason, whose domain involves the regulation of temporal matters.  As Stark notes, this structure is hierarchal insofar as the domain of higher reason is more exalted and among its duties is the control of lower reason.  This structure is also explicitly gendered insofar as Augustine associates higher reason with man and lower reason with woman, although he is willing to grant that men and women possess both capacities (an admission that generates a further tension for his account).  He then supports his position that men and women are created in the image and likeness of God in different senses with the following argument from analogy.  Men are imago dei in and of themselves just as higher reason insofar as it focuses upon the higher, better things (i.e., the immaterial, eternal truths) reflects God's image directly.  However, women are a reflection of God's image only insofar as they are associated with men.  Just as lower reason cannot be an image of God by itself (since it is associated with the physical and temporal), but can be so only insofar as it is joined with higher reason, so too is it with women.  Thus, women, in virtue of their gendered physical state, cannot in and of themselves be an image of God (p. 228).  It is only when they are able somehow to transcend that state that they are, in Augustine's mind, an adequate image of God.  The fact that men too possess a gendered physical state seems not to have been thought to be a hindrance.  As Stark points out, this account serves to reinforce the subordinate status of women.  Stark also emphasizes that it did not have to be this way.  She argues that Augustine had the resources to develop a much more egalitarian account that would have challenged the unjust status quo of his times and made a significant difference in the lives of not only his female contemporaries, but subsequent generations as well (cf. pp. 233-238).  That Augustine did not do so is perhaps understandable, but given his stature, what a wonderful thing it would have been had he done so.

Julie B. Miller presents another thought-provoking discussion generated by Augustine's corpus.  As is well-known, Augustine regarded close personal relationships, including intimate sexual relationships, as a source of pain and lost control of self, rooted in a disordered attachment to the things of this world and neglect of the eternal and the divine.  Miller explores the source of this view and Augustine's concomitant use of sexual imagery in his description of relationship with God, a relationship that for Augustine constitutes a complete fulfillment of self with no risk, pain, or loss.  She traces Augustine's fear of close human relationships and the account of the divine that follows from this to a failure to achieve mutual recognition of subjectivity within relationships, in particular, in his early relationship with his mother (pp. 267-268).  Drawing upon the work of Jessica Benjamin, Miller argues that Augustine's failure to recognize his mother as a subject in and of herself prevents him from regarding himself as a subject, a failure that leads to his reservations concerning human intimate relationships (sexual or otherwise) and his search for a source of intimacy in a safe, secure, all-mighty God.  Her argument is much more complex and nuanced than I can present here, but it has far-reaching implications for understanding Augustine's views.

Penelope Deutscher's essay is an examination of certain ideas raised in Confessions in defense of her position that it is impossible to maintain the so-called sex/gender distinction with any degree of clarity.  Feminists have argued for the distinction in an attempt to divorce the natural from the social in the service of dislodging an entrenched unjust social order masquerading as the natural (and supposedly fixed, an idea contentious in its own right).  The sex/gender distinction is notoriously messy and controversial among feminists.  Deutscher focuses on her own version of the distinction: the contrast between man/woman and masculine/feminine.  She argues that the traditional oppositional dichotomies set up between these terms (i.e., man/woman; masculine/feminine) break down once one regards them from a theological perspective.  The inter-definitions and relationships among man, woman, and god (sic) construct a dual identity for each (by which she means each entity is both like and unlike another) that is also self-contradictory (although I would argue there are no formal contradictions here).  Thus, she argues that an examination of an overtly theological text, such as Augustine's, illuminates the reasons why feminists are unable to maintain the clear distinctions between man/masculine and woman/feminine that they want to maintain (pp. 295-296).

Deutscher is not concerned with an explication of Augustine's texts for their own sake; rather, she wants to use Augustine's claims to support a larger point in a different debate.  While I find her discussion interesting, it strikes me that she is forced to stretch Augustine's texts far past their original meaning in order to sustain this larger point.  She admits that Augustine's agenda is not her own.  While I would agree with her that historical texts can often be used to illuminate problems in our own debates, I worry that she ends up so contorting Augustine's ideas that they are no longer framed in contexts that he would recognize or agree to.  From Augustine's perspective, God is wholly transcendent (a point Deutscher concedes); thus, it is not clear that God can and ought to be fitted into the general schema Deutscher is working with (although I would agree that Augustine presupposes the kind of dichotomous thinking Deutscher is drawing on).  Deutscher argues not only that we can we define man and woman in terms of how they each resemble and don't resemble god, but also that the divine identity itself depends upon the natures of man and woman (pp. 288-290).  Augustine would never accept this.  While there is a tradition in the Middle Ages of prescinding from created nature to generate language about God, this procedure is always recognized as deficient, capturing only an imperfect, incomplete conception of a wholly transcendent being.  No medieval theorist would take himself to be developing anything like a definition or identity conditions for God from this procedure.  Deutscher's discussion has moved far beyond what could be considered as Augustinian.

Augustine's legacy is a mixed one.  As some of the authors point out, Augustine's views on women were not as extreme as some of his contemporaries.  Nevertheless, his views are bad enough, and his tremendous influence both in the history of the church and upon current church doctrine and attitudes must not be underestimated or dismissed as anachronistic.  On the other hand, as many of the authors also point out, Augustine's texts remain interesting and fruitful, both for increasing our understanding of our intellectual heritage and as a more positive resource for feminist work.  There is a tendency among feminists (and philosophers in at least some quarters) to dismiss the medieval period as uninteresting and lacking in philosophical value.  As a medievalist (and a feminist), I have come to appreciate the intellectual work of the Middle Ages, both as engaging in its own right and as a valuable source of insight for my own work and my own life.  At the very least, it is clear that examining the history of philosophy is important to understand the social/cultural legacy we have inherited for better or for worse.  It is incumbent upon us as scholars to clarify the fundamental positions of this inheritance, allowing it to stand (as much as we are able) on its own terms in all its glory and failures.  Anything else is, in my view, intellectually dishonest.  I see this collection of essays, and Penn State's Rereading the Canon series in general, as an attempt to do just that.  From my perspective, the book succeeds marvelously in its purpose.  This is a book that anyone who has a sincere desire to come to terms with Augustine's legacy and its impact on the lives of both women and men ought to consider reading.