Feminist Interpretations of Hans-Georg Gadamer

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Code, Lorraine (ed.), Feminist Interpretations of Hans-Georg Gadamer, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2003, 424pp, $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0271022442.

Reviewed by Robert J. Dostal, Bryn Mawr College


This collection of essays on feminist interpretations of Hans-Georg Gadamer’s thought is inevitably as much about feminism as it is about Gadamer’s hermeneutical philosophy. Lorraine Code, the editor, has brought together fifteen essays by sixteen authors (one essay is jointly written) from the U.S.A., Canada, and Europe. Many of the contributors’ names are familiar to the philosophical readership. The book is part of the Pennsylvania State Press series, “Re-Reading the Canon,” edited by Nancy Tuana, who contributes to this volume a brief preface which speaks to the series. The book has two parts: “Part One--Hermeneutic Projects, Feminist Interventions: Engendering Gadamerian Conversations” and “Part Two--Feminist Issues: Enlisting Gadamerian Resources,” though this reader does not find that the division marks much of a difference in the essays.

Code frames the collection well with her helpful introduction, entitled “Why Feminists Do Not Read Gadamer.” Her introduction concludes with a section on “Why I Read Gadamer.” The book, for the most part, constitutes an attempt to persuade feminists to read Gadamer. The authors largely assume that feminists either ignore or are hostile to Gadamer’s work. The authors who defend Gadamer present his philosophical hermeneutics as a “fruitful resource” (Susan-Judith Hoffman, “Gadamer’s Philosophical Hermeneutics and Feminist Projects”) for feminist theorizing. The essays are exclusively concerned with Gadamer’s philosophical hermeneutics. There is no attention given to his work on ancient philosophy or to his many essays on aesthetics and the philosophy of art. Understandably, the work that concerns all these readers is Truth and Method (1960). Many make reference to the Gadamer/Habermas exchanges in the 60’s and 70’s and to the Gadamer/Derrida exchange in 1981. A few make use of some of his other essays as they are relevant to or exemplary of his philosophical hermeneutics. For example, Patricia Altenbernd Johnson, in her essay, “Questioning Authority”, makes use of Gadamer’s essays on health and medicine, The Enigma of Health (1996), to illuminate the question of authority. The authors refer to a wide range of feminist thought, though Judith Butler and Donna Haraway are perhaps the most cited feminist writers.

There is a large agreement among the contributors, pro and contra Gadamer, about what is positive about Gadamer’s hermeneutics and what is problematic. They all agree that Gadamer does not address the questions of power and gender and that he is largely silent on political issues. Some find these silences indicative of masculinist philosophy, which veils its repression of the feminine with universalist claims and with silence about gender and power. Others acknowledge the silence but think that Gadamer’s thought can be put to use to support feminist explorations of power, gender and politics. What these commentators uniformly find positive is Gadamer’s critique of positivist, scientistic thought and his refusal epistemologically to assume a God’s-eye point of view. Feminists, we are told, appreciate Gadamer’s account of human experience and human knowing as engaged, situated, historical, and dialogical, though the negative voices in this book warn feminists not to be deceived by this seemingly proto-feminist account. What these feminist philosophers find problematic are Gadamer’s rehabilitation of a set of three concepts (authority, prejudice, and tradition), his claims for the universality of hermeneutic experience as he describes it, and the status of difference, alterity, and the Other in his account. Gadamer defines “understanding” (Verstehen) as coming to agreement. His emphasis on agreement, unity, and continuity runs contrary to the valorization of rupture and difference among feminist thinkers. Several contributors state simply that Gadamer is found to be a conservative thinker.

Let’s look briefly at the individual essays and begin by turning to the four essays which are strongly negative about Gadamer’s philosophy and its relation to feminism. Marie Fleming (“Gadamer’s Conversation: Does the Other Have a Say?”) writes that it is a “grave mistake to think of Gadamer as a potential friend” (110). Gadamer’s view of interpretive understanding “is deeply hostile to feminist values” (111). The primary reason she finds Gadamer’s work so hostile to “feminist values” is that, on her account, “Gadamer’s hermeneutical courting of the other is purely instrumental” (111). His need for unity and the assimilation of the other relegates the other to the position of a useful provocation. Gemma Corradi Fiumara (“The Development of Hermeneutic Prospects”) contests the primacy of the question that she finds in Gadamer’s hermeneutics. By proclaiming this primacy, Gadamer “seems to produce the hermeneutic rendition of our logocratic classicities” (133). Fiumara proposes what she calls “epistemophily,” which is open to both listening and questioning. She finds that Gadamer ignores listening. On her account, “women’s interrogatives represent something that cannot be included” in the Gadamerian questioning. She does note an important assertion of Gadamer that openness and listening are necessary for any human relationship, but she counters that this “unexpected remark” is only an indication that “epistemophily is an incoercible propensity that at times makes itself evident even in inhospitable scenarios such as Gadamer’s outlook” (138). Grace M. Jantzen (“Gadamer, Heidegger, and the Limits of Existence”) finds Gadamer “profoundly anti-feminist” (286), even though he might appear to have affinities for feminist standpoint theory. She calls for developing “a symbolic of natality” (286). The focus of her critique lies with Gadamer’s dependence on Heidegger, whose account of human existence rests on mortality and death. According to Jantzen, death has been used in the Platonic-Christian tradition to develop a rationality that is disembodied and disembedded in material and social reality. Finally, Robin May Schott (“Gender, Nazism, and Hermeneutics”) looks at Gadamer’s biography and raises broad questions about his universal hermeneutics. She accuses him of complicity and accommodating himself to Nazism as he made his career in the 1930’s and 40’s in Nazi Germany. This is a very short essay and the only essay that is a reprint (from “Library of Living Philosophers” volume on Gadamer, edited by Lewis Hahn, 1997).

The other eleven essays find Gadamer’s thought a good resource for feminist thought, though some (Veronica Vasterling, Robin Pappas and William Cowling, Johnson, and Meili Steele) carefully qualify and limit its appropriateness. Vasterling writes, for example, that the “wholesale adoption of Gadamer’s solution is out of the question for feminists” (150). A common topos is the question of Gadamer in relation to postmodern thought. A version of this question is the contrast between a hermeneutics of suspicion (postmodern) and a hermeneutics of trust (Gadamer). Kathleen Roberts Wright (“[En]gendering Dialogue Between Gadamer’s Hermeneutics and Feminist Thought”), for example, argues that we need to get beyond a hermeneutics of suspicion when we are confronted with the non-Western. Our very global and transnational world calls for a turn to Gadamerian hermeneutics. Georgia Warnke (“Hermeneutics and Constructed Identities”) argues that it is philosophically sounder to think of gender identity as being interpreted (Gadamer) rather than as constructed (Butler). Hoffman’s thesis is that Gadamer’s hermeneutics provides an account of knowledge that allows us to conceive of power as formative without reducing meaning to power. Vasterling attempts to “rescue the idea of situatedness and all that it implies from Gadamer’s harmonizing and universalizing tendencies” (178). She finds Gadamer’s over-emphasis on harmony and unity to be rooted in his reliance on Hegel. She further argues that Gadamer fails to distinguish understanding from evaluation. On her account, this distinction is important for a critical approach to one’s situatedness.

Susan Hekman (“The Ontology of Change”) finds that Gadamer offers a positive theory of change in contrast to the negativism of Butler and Derrida. According to Hekman, Gadamer’s hermeneutics provides three additional distinct advantages over postmodernism: 1) for Gadamer, language opens a world to us rather than closing us into a situation; 2) Gadamer, through the concept of “horizon,” makes better sense of the position of the social analyst than the postmodernists, who are in danger of assigning themselves an Archimedean point outside the world; and 3) Gadamer’s ontology is not nihilistic.

The title of the paper written jointly by Robin Pappas and William Cowling is the subtitle of Vasterling’s paper: “Toward a Critical Hermeneutics.” They point out that Gadamer’s hermeneutics is not gendered and that he does not “thematize the body.” Their task is to lay out a project of engendering this hermeneutics and making it critical. They attempt to carry this out, they tell us, by “reading Gadamer’s hermeneutics, in part, through the lens of Donna Haraway’s concept of ’situated knowledges’,” which are always embodied, historical, and material.

Both Linda Martín Alcoff (“Gadamer’s Feminist Epistemology”) and Silja Freudenberger (“The Hermeneutic Conversation as Epistemological Model”) find the basis of a promising epistemology in Gadamerian hermeneutics. Alcoff discusses Gadamer’s hermeneutics in relation to Donald Davidson. Freudenberger limits herself, for the most part, to Anglo-American feminist epistemology. Both find Gadamer useful for feminist theory. Alcoff considers “some of his central positions” to be “nascently feminist,” (232) while Freudenberger writes that Gadamer contributes nolens volens to feminist epistemology (260). For Alcoff there are four central features of Gadamer’s “more realistic, less alienated” conception of reason that are useful to feminism: 1) the openness to alterity; 2) the move from knowledge to understanding; 3) holism in justification; and 4) immanent realism. The primary objection to Gadamer’s hermeneutics is, on her account, the “monotopic” character of its treatment of tradition. Following Walter Mignolo and Enrique Dussel, she calls for a pluritopic understanding of tradition. Freudenberger focuses on Gadamer’s treatment of conversation and the central importance of openness and situatedness for this concept of conversation.

Unlike any of the other essays, Meili Steele (“Three Problematics of Linguistic Vulnerability: Gadamer, Benhabib, and Butler”) addresses a prominent controversy within feminist thought that exists independent of Gadamer. His essay is the longest and the most detailed in this collection. The controversy is that between the critical-theory position of Seyla Benhabib and the postmodernist position of Butler. Steele argues that “both Benhabib and Butler, in opposing ways, remain caught in the Enlightenment desire to achieve liberty, justice and clarity by setting up a philosophical problematic over and against a historical phenomenology, by trying to leap out of the hermeneutic circle” (336). He finds Gadamer’s hermeneutic phenomenology to be indispensable for feminist political theory. Steele provides an excellent account of the differences between Benhabib and Butler. His argument is dialectical in that Gadamer provides a third position that is able to mediate the differences between these two important feminist thinkers. Benhabib separates individual agency and language while Butler gives us linguistic agency without persons. Gadamer, according to Steele, shows us how we can live through our linguistic heritage. Understanding, on his account, trumps genealogy. Like Hekman, Steele argues that a basic difficulty with Butler’s position concerns how she can account for it. He writes:

There is a limit to how far we can read our predecessors and contemporaries as “dupes” of processes that they do not understand but that are available to the critic armed with a theory and a therapeutic interest. We have to be able to account for our own ability to escape and for the values that drive this effort… . Butler’s problematic offers no way to discriminate among languages that empower and those that do damage, for this would require more guidance than is available from reference to a transcendental generator of liberty through effects (354).

Steele finds the limit of Gadamer’s thought in his “insensitivity to the multiplicity of traditions and to the different effects of power” (347).

There are a few moments in the book that are personal or confessional. Fleming confesses that she has given up the “sisterhood ideal.” Johnson discusses the question of authority through the example of her becoming department chair. Laura Duhn Kaplan in the volume’s concluding essay (“Three Applications of Gadamer’s Hermeneutics: Philosophy-Faith-Feminism”) writes that in her life her philosophy, her faith, and her feminism come nicely together in a Gadamerian way: “In my philosophy, my faith, and my feminism, I practice understanding as Gadamer has described it. I place myself within a tradition, and then continuously fuse past and present as I negotiate a modern life within traditional horizons” (368). Her statement that “sometimes I think I am driven by a blind imperative to preserve Jewish tradition at all costs” would seem to support the negative critics’ views about the “traditionalism” and conservatism of Gadamer’s thought and would run contrary to the reading of Gadamer on tradition that is not traditionalist (Johnson, Alcoff).

The brevity of most of these essays does not allow for either careful examination of Gadamer’s texts or for engaging current feminist thought. More than one essay lays out a “project” but can only sketch it and not carry it out in this format. This is, of course, not the fault of the authors but simply the nature of the beast—a collection of essays. The rhetoric of the appeals to feminism in this volume I often found puzzling and seemingly self-contradictory. Though some of the contributors like Alcoff carefully qualify what they mean when they use terms like “feminine,” “woman,” or “feminist,” others make pronouncements about what feminism is or what feminists think in apparently stereotypical and totalizing ways. Perhaps it is self-conscious and meant to be provocative. Perhaps not. Gadamer is attacked for using the first person plural, a “we” that illegitimately means to speak for women. Yet several of the authors in the volume do not seem to hesitate using “we” to speak for feminists generally. This too seems to be the nature of the beast—essays that are to consider a philosophical position from the perspective of an “ism”—in this case, feminism.

Nonetheless there are things to learn in this volume about Gadamer and about feminism. The consensus of the volume is that feminism is largely “postmodern.” The authors of this volume, for the most part, are suggesting in a variety of ways that this state of affairs should be modified or substantially changed—and that Gadamer’s hermeneutics helps show the way.