Feminist Interpretations of John Rawls

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Ruth Abbey (ed.), Feminist Interpretations of John Rawls, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2013, 181pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780271061801.

Reviewed by S. A. Lloyd, University of Southern California


This collection of essays addressing Rawls's work from a variety of feminist perspectives is part of a series created by Nancy Tuana, "Re-reading the Canon", that investigates how the assumptions of canonical Western philosophers concerning gender are embedded within their theories. The series attempts to help transform the canon by re-reading the works with an eye to discovering how far a philosopher's socially inherited gender prejudices are expugnable from his or her core philosophical positions. In the case of the present volume, that aim is supplemented by consideration of the usefulness of Rawls's work for the feminist purpose of advancing women's interests.

Arguably the most valuable element of this volume is Ruth Abbey's masterful introduction chronicling feminist engagement with Rawls's ideas from first publication of A Theory of Justice through Political Liberalism to The Law of Peoples. Her survey, which she terms a "biography of a bibliography", skillfully imposes some thematic order on a critical literature encompassing widely divergent concerns and methods, situating works of more than two dozen commentators across various interpretive dimensions. She describes the early response to TJ, which centered on Rawls's treatment of the family, as largely hopeful about the feminist potential of justice as fairness, while responses to Political Liberalism's attempt to accommodate reasonable pluralism were divided (as was indeed the larger philosophical community) over whether the transformative power of the theory had been more diminished than enhanced by public reason constraints on political justification.

It is challenging to bring the surveyed feminist commentators, and the eight in this volume, fully into conversation with one another because differences in their projects often put them at cross-purposes. Within the feminist literature we can distinguish (a) those who seek to advance Rawls's own project, or uncover what positions Rawls affirms or intends, or determine to what feminist positions Rawls's theory provides resources to construct by way of friendly amendment or expansion, from (b) those aiming to show how ideas present in Rawls's work can be differently used to do things Rawls did not intend, in contrast to (c) those intending to reveal what Rawls is somehow committed to quite contrary to his intention, from (d) those laying naked alleged mistakes or omissions in Rawls then used as foils against which to construct the author's preferred position.

Into this last category fall the essays by both Janice Richardson and Nancy Hirschmann in the present volume. In "Jean Hampton's Reworking of Rawls", Richardson dismisses Rawls's aim of finding principles of justice for his limited but central purpose of ordering society's basic structure, instead endorsing Hampton's radically different project of devising a contractarian test for the justice of all interpersonal relationships that appeals only to the rationality of self-interested individuals. The title is misleading, for while Hampton was attracted to a generally contractarian method of justification, she neither "reworked" Rawls nor claimed to. Richardson's thought seems to be that since we intuit that subordination is unjust, devising a direct test for subordination applicable to every personal relationship, as Hampton does, provides a better approach to developing a theory of social justice than whatever contractarian project Rawls is pursuing.

People interested in Rawls's own project will find more profit in Hirschmann's paper "Rawls, Freedom, and Disability: A Feminist Rereading", even though it also deploys Rawls primarily as a point from which to contrast. Hirschmann takes Rawls's project of finding principles of justice to govern the basic structure that orders social cooperation among those assumed to be normally cooperating members of society over a complete life, as the occasion to consider disability. Although she presents her discussion as a critique of Rawls's "masculinist" and able-bodied "conception of the self", and his "indifference" to social relationships, it in fact offers an attractive new conception of able-bodiedness that Rawls could well endorse. Hirschmann develops a plausible argument that when we think about disability through the lens of freedom rather than justice, we will find that how free one is to engage in productive social cooperation depends more on how the society structures facilities and valued occupations than it does on the "medical" conditions of individuals. Being unable to ambulate, for example, will constrain one's freedom to participate productively only if society is so structured that desirable work and access to the workplace require ambulation. Yet these are not any sort of brute facts dictated by the cosmos, but rather matters of social decision. Perhaps some medical conditions are so out of the ordinary (say catatonia) that organizing social life to make those who have them equally free to participate is either impossible or prohibitively expensive in light of competing social needs. But surely, for standard sorts of medical infirmities having to do with sight, hearing, mobility, endurance, and intellectual capacity, we could design our social world so as to include those with them as at least partially cooperating, and often fully cooperating members.

Rawls's principles of justice apply to a basic structure governing the relations of all those capable at some point in a complete life of engaging in social cooperation. Hirschmann argues that disabled persons can be capable of such cooperation. So, Rawls's principles of justice will apply very broadly indeed. They will still not apply to a system that governs, in the first instance, those who fall outside Hirschmann's redrawn sphere of social cooperative ability, neither humans nor non-human animals for that matter. So critiques of Rawls as anthropocentric will certainly remain. And those who object to the very idea that social justice settles the fair terms of social cooperation among cooperators will continue to dismiss Rawls's conception as inadequate, for why should the ability to cooperate productively mark the boundary of social justice? Hirschmann's new analysis of disability in terms of freedom is better understood as a genuine advance in the philosophical debate over the conceptualization of disability, ability, and social value than it is as a discovery of some new defect in Rawls's approach to social justice. If we think the question whether justice (as opposed to mere benevolence) requires that we organize social roles and facilities so as to enable the maximum number of people to be contributing members of society, regardless of whatever costs or inefficiencies that might impose, the mechanism for doing that is already in place in Rawls's Original Position.

On the opposite end of the spectrum of modes of engagement with Rawls's theory are the contributions of Amy Baehr and Eileen Hunt Botting, who both work out Rawls's politically liberal project. In her paper, Baehr investigates the relationship between liberal feminisms and public political feminism. She notes that among the many comprehensive feminisms we affirm there are some that will be compatible with political liberalism's public reason constraints and others that will not. Which forms of feminism, even liberal feminism, can accept political liberalism's principled requirement that state power may legitimately be used only in accordance with a constitution the essentials of which can be endorsed by all subject to it in light of reasons they too can accept? Which forms of liberal feminism could be part of an overlapping consensus on political liberalisms' civility requirement that all offer only public reasons?

Baehr seeks to motivate the inquiry, arguing that feminisms that refuse to reason in terms of public values are not just imprudent, because they alienate others that they might have persuaded, or get stuck with less than the best public understanding of public values from a feminist perspective because they did not guide the debate, but also immoral, because they thereby disrespect other reasonable people (155). This powerful claim could do with more argument than her space here allows. But even among liberal feminisms, she notes, some are comprehensive in a way that does not provide principled support for public reason. Baehr contrasts a liberal feminism that privileges individual choice ("concerned not with promoting a particular, substantive way of life for women but with making it possible for women to live lives that are good by their own lights" (161)), with a liberal feminism that endorses women's independence and self-sufficiency as an ideal. She criticizes the latter, termed Popular Liberal Feminism, which advances a list of equalizing measures for women and seeks to use coercive state power to further its substantive ends, while endorsing the former, termed "the autonomy account" as offering at least a pragmatic reason for accepting the duty of civility to limit calls on state power to those that can be supported with public reasons. That pragmatic reason is supposed to be that the freedom of the conditions of choice is of value, just by itself. It follows that to be subjected to a basic structure for reasons we could not even in principle accept violates that value of the self-chosen life.

Historians of political philosophy may balk at Baehr's identification of the individuality account as valuing "autonomy", as this is usually associated with Kant, who held that autonomous choices are constrained by strict norms of right and not a matter of mere lifestyle preferences. Choosing only as your appetite or taste suggests will not count as autonomous by Kant's standard. That "do your own thing" individuality account is better associated with John Stuart Mill, who provides an affirmative argument for the value of choosing for oneself, even if poorly, and even when the choice is wrong.

The Millian position is the one Baehr promotes as fully compatible with political liberalism's commitment to public reason. There we have one liberal feminism compatible with public reason. But we feminists had better hope that it is not the only feminism so suited, because as presented it depends on such contestable claims as that, in her words, "a good life, by its very nature, cannot be imposed. This is because the minimal condition for a life's being good is that . . . the fundamental conditions under which one lives -- the basic structure of society . . . is recognized as such [good] by the person who lives it". (163-64) This entails that unless you see your society's basic structure as just, you cannot have a good life at all. No one who's ever lived in any unjust society has had a good life, meaning no one has ever lived a good life. This is too much to demand.

Eileen Hunt Botting's "Rawls on International Justice" compares Martha Nussbaum's capabilities approach to defending women's rights in situations of cultural and religious conflict to Rawls's politically liberal tolerance of differences with decent but non-liberal peoples in international affairs. She argues that Rawls's framework of providing voluntary incentives for the adoption of changes conducive to the realization of womens' rights would do more to advance womens' interests than would Nussbaum's capabilities approach under conditions of cultural and religious conflict. Because, in Rawls, assistance to burdened societies can be conditioned on (and thus encourages) respect for human rights, it incentivizes the voluntary adoption of changes toward securing women's rightful position. Botting notes that Nussbaum shares with Rawls a non-metaphysical conception of human rights as grown out of cultural and political traditions, but she criticizes Nussbaums's critique of Rawls, arguing that the international social contract would indeed take into account women's interests (127). It is not clear that Botting's reply to what she takes to be Nussbaum's position really does do justice to Nussbaum's larger critique of Rawls's assumption that parties to the social contract are all free and equal and seek and can expect mutual advantage. Botting's main point, however, is that

the universalistic language of the capabilities approach, coupled with its establishment of a global minimum standard of human flourishing and human rights for men and women alike, makes it less likely to garner the support of nonliberal or fundamentalist religious peoples whose traditions demand that they see and treat women as unequal or subordinate to men. (131)

Rawls, she argues, does better at delivering for women globally than a more comprehensive and demanding feminism like Nussbaum's could now when stringently misogynistic comprehensive doctrines still flourish among otherwise decent peoples.

Between these two poles of interpretive approach, Anthony Simon Laden's paper argues, in reply to Catharine MacKinnon's critique, that Rawls's account of political justification -- which Laden says requires reasons that emerge from a political process of reasonable deliberation sensitive to citizens' practical identities -- uses a norm of objectivity that should be acceptable to feminists because it "authorizes a rejection of hierarchical social relations" (38). Elizabeth Brake's paper shows Rawls's political liberalism to have a principled limit to its toleration of inequality within childrearing families set by the requirements of securing to all children the primary good of recognition of self-respect. Lisa Schwartzman's contribution criticizes Rawls's theory on the ground that as a form of liberalism focused on individuals, it cannot address social hierarchies that subordinate group members. She dismisses as unavailable to Rawls Susan Moller Okin's effort to amend Rawls's theory so as to make it friendlier to feminisms. Rawls "fails to describe in much detail the cultural and social forces that create and sustain social hierarchies" (54), and because she thinks this is necessary to have feminist change, Schwartzman's view regards Rawls's theory as useless except perhaps as a critical foil. Claire Chambers puzzles over the meaning and importance of the basic structure in Rawls's system, rejecting Rawls's insistence that his principles of justice apply directly only to society's basic structure but do not internally order its component institutions, like courts and the family, nor associations outside it, such as universities and churches.

Dedicated Rawls scholars may be put off by discussions that do more to concoct confusion than contribute clarity by their treatment of Rawls's concepts, including not just the "basic structure", but "relevant social position" and "well-ordered society", which Rawls ties to specific principles of justice rather than treating as some authors here do as fixed abstractions. The "well-ordered society of justice as fairness" is importantly unlike the "well-ordered society of utilitarianism". And which social positions are relevant in each depends on their respective principles of justice. The "worst off representative person under utilitarianism" may have no primary goods at all; the worst off under justice as fairness will have an equal share of basic rights and liberties, and opportunities satisfying fair equality requirements, with a share of income and wealth satisfying the difference principle. What social positions there are, that exist, depend on the principles of justice. Misunderstandings of such Rawlsian ideas compromise the present volume's success in fulfilling its aspiration to rethink the canon, which cannot be rethought before it is understood. To readers primarily interested in thinking through feminist concerns about justice, it may matter less whether the picture of Rawls's view is accurate. All these essays are lively feminist engagements with problems of social justice. There is much to be appreciated here, even if it isn't always much to do with Rawls.