Feminist Interpretations of Ludwig Wittgenstein

Placeholder book cover

O'Connor, Peg and Scheman, Naomi (eds.), Feminist Interpretations of Ludwig Wittgenstein, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2002, 472pp, $34.50 (pbk), ISBN 0271021985.

Reviewed by Mark Lance , Georgetown University


Feminist Interpretations of Wittgenstein (FIW) is a new installment in the Re-reading the Canon series edited by Nancy Tuana. This series has set for itself a rather difficult task. Many of the earliest volumes dealt with writers for which feminism, or at least issues closely related to feminism, were central themes. It is clear now, however, that the goal is to attempt to read a far wider range of important historical philosophers through the lens of feminism.

In the case of Wittgenstein such a task seems on the surface particularly difficult. Not only does Wittgenstein not discuss feminism per se, but he rarely deals with moral or political philosophy at all, and when he does, the results are hardly his finest accomplishments. Further, there is a strong emphasis in Wittgenstein’s work which would seem to militate against his usefulness for feminist projects. Repeatedly Wittgenstein urges that language – and more generally practice – is in order as it stands, that it is philosophy which leads us into trouble. What then to make of the project of using Wittgenstein for a philosophical project that is always revisionary, and often revolutionary.

Almost none of the articles in FIW actually attempt a feminist interpretation of Wittgenstein. This is not, however, a bad thing, as it would be difficult to imagine such an effort being successful. Despite the above mentioned surface conflict, however, a number of Wittgensteinian ideas, concepts, distinctions, and philosophical directions have been utilized by feminist philosophers, and at their best the articles in this collection develop these ideas and show how one can employ Wittgenstein in feminist projects.

Alice Crary takes up the project of feminist epistemology, centrally its emphasis on standpoints as a starting point for an interrogation of the ways that epistemic practices function politically. Crary argues that there is a plausible development of Wittgensteinian ideas which allows us to make sense of these ideas, and to reformulate the goal of objectivity, without devolving into relativism or irrationalism.

Peg O’Connor takes up the Wittgensteinian idea of a language game, and urges, contra Wittgenstein, that a creative approach to such games is not only possible, but potentially politically libratory. In this way O’Connor argues, as do Wendy Lee and others, that there are practical political strategies to be gleaned from reflection on Wittgensteinian ideas.

The most creative, and to my mind best, articles in the collection are those of Hilde Lindemann Nelson and Sarah Lucia Hoagland. Nelson takes on the anti-theoretical trends in recent pragmatism and postmodernism. Both, she argues, move overly quickly from a rejection of traditional philosophical conceptions of theory – in terms of essences, fixed definitions, necessary laws – to a rejection of theory or even conceptualization. She makes quite creative use of the Wittgensteinian ideas of family resemblance and language games in her effective critique of these trends.

Sarah Lucia Hoagland focuses on the Wittgensteinian conception of nonsense to tackle various unproductive debates in philosophy and politics. She argues that ways in which debates over privilege, for example, often break down can be understood in terms of a Wittgensteinian picture of the way that concepts are rooted in practice. When disputants approach a particular issue from widely different linguistic practices, she argues, the their claims can come across to one another as nonsense, in the Wittgensteinian sense of that term. Hoagland goes on to make a fascinating – though in my view unsuccessful – argument for separatism on the basis of this analysis. Whatever the merits of the final conclusion, the article is fascinating.

As should be clear, this book is not really something that is designed for those whose primary interest is Wittgenstein. But for those with an interest in feminist theory and an openness to Wittgensteinian ideas, it makes many valuable contributions.