Feminist Interpretations of Mary Astell

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Alice Sowaal and Penny A. Weiss (eds.), Feminist Interpretations of Mary Astell, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2016, 229pp., $44.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780271071251.

Reviewed by Patricia Sheridan, University of Guelph


This volume is a welcome addition to the historical scholarship on Mary Astell, offering papers that explore the philosophical significance of this undeservedly overlooked thinker. What makes this collection especially engaging is its very topical exploration of Astell's feminism, finding in her a treatment of diverse but related issues including gendered power relations, self-esteem and women's empowerment, trauma and its effects, anti-essentialism, and systematized gender discrimination. Though each paper stands alone, together they form a unified impression of Astell's thought. The reader gains an appreciation of Astell's philosophical commitments and the systematic interplay of her ethics, theology, metaphysics, epistemology, and feminism.

Penny A. Weiss's introductory essay, 'Locations and Legacies: Reading Mary Astell and Re-Reading the Canon', lays out the general aims of the volume, which are, first, to locate Astell by identifying her role in the intellectual debates of her period, and second, to establish her legacy. While there may be a number of avenues to pursue in the latter regard, this volume's focus is Astell's feminist legacy. As Weiss notes, Astell's feminist credentials are not, on the face of it, straightforward -- although she championed women's rationality and the need for women's education, Weiss explains, her 'devotion to God, her Tory allegiances, and her defence of conventional marriage' have made her a somewhat ambiguous figure in the history of feminist thought. (2) The papers in this collection take up the challenge of demonstrating Astell's feminist legacy and do so with a sensitivity to her time and place. The papers included in this volume draw attention to her originality and importance as an early modern philosopher but, more than this, interpret and adapt her ideas through a modern feminist lens. As Weiss explains, this approach to Astell draws attention to her own brand of feminism and offers us new ways of engaging feminist concerns today.

Jacqueline Broad's 'Mary Astell and the Virtues' explores the feminist implications of Astell's virtue ethics. Astell is notable for her emphasis on women's moral improvement as the means to their self-realization. To this end, she emphasizes the importance for women of perfecting character traits such as charity, friendship, generosity, and, above all, prudence. Broad acknowledges that Astell's feminism may sound antiquated, with her emphasis on personal moral development rather than overt political change. However, Astell's focus on excellence of character can, Broad writes, 'be interpreted as a strength and not a weakness.' (19) Broad argues that Astell's program carries a profoundly consciousness-raising message -- Astell sought to provide women with the means for understanding their own self-worth. Broad discusses the various passions and Astell's prescription for their virtuous expression, concluding with a discussion of prudence and its primacy in Astell's program. For Astell, Broad explains, an imprudent person lacks the ability to compare and judge, or to act proportionately and appropriately. In an age when women were not considered autonomous agents, she proposed a virtue-theoretical education in self-governance. As Broad writes, Astell sought to show that 'women have the means to their liberation . . . within themselves.' (32) This paper sets the tone for this volume, establishing the interiority, if you will, of Astell's feminism. While the more radical programs of later feminisms may have been well beyond what Astell could contemplate, her emphasis on building women's inner strength and sense of self arguably lays important groundwork for change.

Kathleen A. Ahearn's 'Mary Astell's Account of Feminine Esteem' explores Astell's unique concept of self-esteem as a feminist elaboration of Descartes's notion of self-mastery and the regulation of the passions. Astell draws on Descartes's notion of habituated introspection to develop a theory of feminine self-esteem as the interior achievement of the God-given virtues of goodness, kindness, and justice. True self-esteem, Ahearn explains, would direct women not at some external, usually male, source of appraisal, but only at what God intended for each of us. Astell's view envisions self-esteem as a balance of self-care and care of others, which Ahearn suggests has resonance with feminist concerns today. Astell believed that our relationships with others must be guided not by selflessness but by benevolent self-love -- the benevolent person acts as an expression of their perfection. This requires freeing the self from the undue influence of the passions -- women must align their will with God's will rather than letting the passions alone be their guide. Engaging in habituation and meditation will allow women to express their passions in the most virtuous way. Astell's is a theory of women's self-possession and agency that brings together rationality and passion as the expression of our divinely-inspired natures. Ahearn discusses John Norris and occasionalism, virtue ethics, and Cartesianism as powerful influences on Astell's thinking, showing ultimately that Astell produced an original and insightful account of feminine self-possession.

Alice Sowaal's 'Mary Astell and the Development of Vice: Pride, Courtship, and the Woman's Human Nature Question' locates Astell's feminism within the human-nature question that divided seventeenth-century intellectuals. The controversy, however, seemed to surround the question of man's intrinsic nature; women's natures were generally, and uncontroversially, considered weaker than men's and more prone to the undue influence of emotion -- a view Sowaal labels the 'Woman's Defective Nature Prejudice'. (60) Astell's emphasis on women's education was inspired by her insight that this prejudice was not merely wrong but self-perpetuating -- discouraged from exercising their own judgment, women come to believe themselves incapable of doing so. Women, for Astell, can be stultified by this myth about their natures and thereby prevented from developing as self-governing rational agents. Without reason as their guide their natural virtues are corruptible -- generosity, for example, morphs into a striving for superficial perfections, vanity, and pride. Sowaal explains that this problem is most apparent for Astell in courtship, when women are easily manipulated into unfortunate marriages. Sowaal concludes noting that Astell's assertion of a positive answer to the woman's human nature question 'anticipates a discussion of essentialism' (70) that aligns with contemporary feminist concerns.

Karen Detlefsen's 'Custom, Freedom, and Equality: Mary Astell on Marriage and Women's Education' considers an apparent tension in Astell's thought: Can we call Astell a feminist even if she believed that the institution of marriage is a relationship of inequality between men and women? Detlefsen's answer is yes. Astell, she explains, employed Cartesian epistemological and ontological principles to argue that all human souls are equally rational and equipped with the capacity for clear and distinct ideas. Since opinion is by its very foundations uncertain and open to doubt for Astell, the rational individual can discern that social conventions are open to critical scrutiny, especially if they denigrate women. That said, marriage, which Astell accepts as an unequal relationship between men and women, withstands her scrutiny. Detlefsen explains that marriage is more than merely a convention for Astell; it is a divinely-ordained covenant. As such, it serves God, which Astell believes is paramount for all human endeavor. Detlefsen shows that although marriage for Astell is, by divine sanction, a partnership requiring a wife's submission to her husband, it is, nevertheless, a partnership of rational agents. Any unjustified power relations within marriage (e.g. abusive relations) are, in principle, open to debate and are changeable. Detlefsen concludes that although Astell's theological account of marriage 'precludes a more far-reaching feminism,' (91) it does not cancel out her commitment to women's rational agency and the feminist promise of her account.

Susan Paterson Glover's 'Further Reflections upon Marriage: Mary Astell and Sarah Chapone' considers Astell's influence on the eighteenth century thinker Sarah Chapone. Chapone penned the pamphlet The Hardships of the English Laws in Relation to Wives, which is, Glover shows, an application of Astell's analysis of marital relations and her conventionalist account of custom. For Astell, informed choice is the best defence against bad marriages, but her prescription for women stuck in abusive marriages was to retreat into a life of religious contemplation and intellectual self-improvement. Chapone takes Astell's call to reason and advances a more concrete proposal for women's security within marriage -- Chapone set forth a political agenda for legislative change. This paper offers a detailed examination of Chapone's work and illuminates the feminist inspiration Chapone took from Astell's ideas.

Elisabeth Hedrick Moser's 'Mary Astell: Some Reflections upon Trauma' considers the abusive domestic situations described by Astell in terms of modern descriptions of psychic trauma found in the work of Judith Herman, Miranda Fricker, and Cathy Caruth. Though post-traumatic stress disorder (PTSD) was not understood as such in Astell's day, she was remarkably attuned to the debilitating effects of abuse on a woman's psychic state. Moser argues that Astell's language around this topic maps onto the symptoms of trauma identified by Herman -- Astell's description of the feeling women experience of being constantly under threat captures Herman's notion of hyperarousal; her description of women's feelings of helplessness and detachment captures Herman's notion of constriction; and her description of women's endless and recurring experience of abuse within marriage captures Herman's notion of intrusion. Astell, Moser points out, made the unprecedented move of naming women's suffering and allowing women to recognize what they have lost. Astell emphasizes women's rational potential for communion with the divine, providing the abused woman a sense of purpose in spiritual practice. More than this, Astell encourages women-only retreats where than can exist in a safe and like-minded community. Astell's emphasis on personal growth and spiritual health, Moser explains, provides just the kind of process for healing from trauma that we find in contemporary literature.

Weiss's 'From the Throne to Every Private Family: Mary Astell as Analyst of Power' takes its inspiration from Valerie Bryson's claim that early feminism lacked the robust analysis of power relations that constitutes a political program. Weiss sets out to show that Astell's work reveals an analysis of power that is both original and insightful. She begins by looking at Astell's view that education is at once a force of oppression and the key to liberation -- power is most effectively maintained by segregated systems of education and is most effectively dismantled when education is universal and equal. Astell is well aware that the problem with women's education arises not from any inferiority in their innate abilities but from the stigmatization and discouragement girls suffer. The power of dissuasion relies on a social structure that allows it. Weiss draws attention to Astell's analysis of the failings of the system of education and how these failings make some groups in society more vulnerable. Further, Astell recognizes that an unequal system can encourage disregard for the wisdom of the subordinated, anticipating contemporary concepts of subordinated knowledges. Weiss finds in Astell a striking breadth of analysis -- regarding the subtle and not-so-subtle power dynamics of education, religious rites, and interpersonal relations. Astell, she shows, had a prescient sense of the patriarchy and its essential misogyny. Under such a system, women and men are corrupted, working with false conceptions of what it means to be rational, civil, and self-realizing.

Christine Mason Sutherland's 'Mary Astell's Feminism: A Rhetorical Perspective' looks at the political implications of Astell's call for women's training in rhetoric. Effective communication was a cornerstone of Astell's program of women's education. Astell, Sutherland points out, believed that a proper education would empower single and married women who were subject to abuse and discrimination, and could provide them with tools for living happier more productive lives. Astell encouraged women's training in a particular form of rhetoric called sermo, the private rhetoric of conversation and letters. Sermo is non-dogmatic and non-confrontational and engages the same virtues as social behavior; effective persuaders should convince without triumphing over others. Though Astell envisioned a full education for women, Sutherland surmises that Astell intended training in rhetoric as a starting point until her fuller educational program could be instituted. Astell, she explains, saw in this training a means for women to develop piece of mind and self-confidence, to make better marital choices, and to gain credibility as rational actors in their own right.

Marcy P. Lascano's 'Mary Astell on the Existence and Nature of God' marks a bit of a departure in emphasis. Lascano states at the outset that her paper will not consider Astell's feminist views but will focus on the originality of Astell's theology and her contribution to contemporary theological debates. While this may seem somewhat out of place with the rest of the papers in this volume, Lascano makes a compelling case for Astell's astuteness as an early modern theologian -- one with egalitarian moral ends in view. Lascano characterizes Astell's arguments for God's existence as a unique blend of ontological and cosmological arguments. Lascano suggests that Astell sought to ground her belief that morality is a matter both of introspection regarding God's nature and will and our recognition that human reason has its causal origin in the divine will. One of Astell's central insights, Lascano notes, is that men and women are metaphysically and morally equal -- male and female minds are equally capable of understanding God's nature and their duties to God. Lascano suggests that it is therefore not surprising that Astell takes the proof of God's existence and nature so seriously -- for Astell, it is by considering the moral perfection of rational beings like ourselves that we achieve a conception of God's nature (albeit a limited one). Lascano considers at length Astell's arguments for God's perfection, sovereignty, and indivisibility, showing how Astell was 'pushing the debates forward' in her drive to ground morality in natural human reason (186).

In the final paper, 'The Emerging picture of Mary Astell's Views', Sowaal provides a contextual overview of the themes covered, arguing that the Astell that emerges is a systematic thinker whose philosophical views inform her analysis of women's lived experience. Lacking the support of a scholarly tradition, Astell is as yet a relatively obscure figure, but collections such as the present one, Sowaal suggests, form the beginning of an interpretive framework. The very notion of a philosophical canon, she proposes, might well be altered or even abandoned by greater attention to the 'minor' figures in the history of philosophy. Sowaal discusses the themes of education, friendship, marriage, equality, and freedom as they are developed throughout these papers and as they cohere with Astell's metaphysical, epistemological, and ethical commitments. Sowaal suggests that while these papers have focused on Astell's relevance to contemporary feminist interests there is room for exploring other kinds of intersectionality -- for example how Astell's views might bear on issues of race, class, or sexuality -- that offer avenues for future Astell studies.

This volume makes a clear and compelling case for the importance, and relevance, of Mary Astell. Very often, women from this period are either viewed as mouthpieces of male thinkers or otherwise derivative of their ideas. Astell comes across, rightly, as an inventive and astute philosopher, whose feminism formed a central part of her system of thought. In her preface, series editor Nancy Tuana, proposes that a canon does not signify a static and absolute body of essential texts in a given discipline so much as it reflects what that discipline considers representative of its foundations and its definitive accomplishments. Astell's prescient and forward-thinking views about women's rationality and agency, and the interplay of these ideas with her ethical, metaphysical, and theological views, suggest a history of philosophy that is at once richer, more accurate, and, as Alice Sowaal so aptly puts it, offers 'a more expansive vision of our future.' (206) This is a highly recommended, engaging, and important collection.