Feminist Interpretations of Maurice Merleau-Ponty

Placeholder book cover

Dorothea Olkowski and Gail Weiss (eds.), Feminist Interpretations of Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2006, 290pp., $39.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780271029184.

Reviewed by Gayle Salamon, Princeton University


There are few philosophers more deserving of a feminist reconsideration than Merleau-Ponty, as this excellent volume demonstrates. Nancy Tuana describes the motivation of the Re-Reading the Canon series in a general preface:

Feminist philosophers have begun to look critically at the canonized texts of philosophy and have concluded that the discourses of philosophy are not gender-neutral. Philosophical narratives do not offer a universal perspective, but rather privilege some experiences and beliefs over others.

Phenomenology presents itself as an unusually suitable partner in this endeavor, for like feminism, phenomenology also understands its project to be an unsettling of the fantasy of a universal perspective, and the means by which it accomplishes this unsettling is careful and close attention to the perspectival nature of experience and of the world. Co-editor Dorothea Olkowski provides a concise and useful introduction of phenomenology's place in philosophy, Merleau-Ponty's place in phenomenology, and prior feminist engagements with Merleau-Ponty, beginning (as so many feminist origins stories do) with Beauvoir. This volume is not an introduction to Merleau-Ponty, or to feminist philosophy, and each of the essays assumes some familiarity with Merleau-Ponty and early feminist responses to him, though Olkowski's introduction and the first essay by Sonia Kruks provide helpful orientation through the history of these engagements for less-familiar readers. It is instead a guided tour through the current state of feminist Merleau-Ponty criticism, and the result is a strong and impressively expansive collection.

Merleau-Ponty's insights about the centrality of embodiment to subjectivity make him a particularly apposite interlocutor for feminists, though he has been an underutilized resource for feminist philosophy, with a few notable exceptions. This dearth of feminist attention may be in part due to the arguably masculinist readings of his theories of body and perception offered by some of his more prominent readers. One might think, for instance, of Hubert Dreyfus's contention that the Phenomenology of Perception describes the relation between self and world as one of maximal grip, a description confuted by the rather more delicate and ambiguous metaphors -- a soap bubble, or an intertwining -- that Merleau-Ponty himself relied upon, particularly in his later work, to describe the intricate styles of being that we are.

Merleau-Ponty's earliest feminist interlocutors, Beauvoir and Irigaray, understood his philosophy of the body to be a generalization and universalization that negated gender, and a few of the pieces in this collection offer critiques along these same lines -- Beata Stawarska's critique of Merleau-Ponty's "masculine frame of mind" (92) most notably. However, most of them do not, and it is the abandonment of the well-trodden path of more familiar feminist criticism in favor of less expected territory that makes this volume both fresh and indispensible.

Sonia Kruks' essay "Merleau-Ponty and the Problem of Difference in Feminism" reverses that now-familiar staging of the encounter between the two; instead of asking what feminism can help us understand about Merleau-Ponty, she asks what Merleau-Ponty can help us understand about feminism, and the result is a sharp and skillful critique of "multiple-difference feminism." Kruks suggests that recourse to Merleau-Ponty's account of embodiment might ameliorate some of the unhappy results of multiple-difference feminism's "epistemology of provenance." His account dialectically asserts the necessary particularity of embodied perspective alongside the necessary sociality inhering in the fact that my perspective is always enmeshed with others' perspectives. For Kruks, as for other contributors, the most crucial issue is not the sexism in Merleau-Ponty's writings, although that sexism is not a settled question: some of the contributors agree with the antecedent feminist charges of sexism and some do not. It is rather an issue of where feminist readers interested in Merleau-Ponty might go from here. As Kruks writes: "In spite of his sexism, may not Merleau-Ponty's account of the prepersonal body in fact help us to grasp significant aspects of human existence that span such distinctions as class, race, and gender?" (35)

If there is some consensus that Merleau-Ponty demonstrates "tacit normative assumptions," in Johanna Oksala's words, about gender and sexuality, this admission cannot answer the question of how phenomenology may yet help us conceive of gender and sexuality in ways that Merleau-Ponty himself could not. In her essay, Oksala suggests that previous feminist readings of Merleau-Ponty committed the error of foundationalism, and that his conception of embodied subjectivity is in fact more flexible, more capacious, and more contingent than has previously been acknowledged. Oksala argues that understanding Merleau-Ponty's theorization of the unrepressed "free" body as tacitly male, as Iris Marion Young does, or his understanding of sexuality as fundamentally heterosexual, as Judith Butler does, misconstrues Merleau-Ponty's understanding of historical situatedness and underestimates the consequences for subjectivity and intersubjectivity if the body is always a lived body. Oksala argues instead that "there can be no one universal or inherent normativity of the living body" (221). When Oksala states, contra Butler: "my argument is that a nonfoundationalist reading of Merleau-Ponty's body-subject can provide feminist theory with an account of the female body that acknowledges its generative status instead of viewing it only as a passive product of cultural crafting" (225), she is suggesting that Merleau-Ponty's theory of embodiment is more resonant with Butler's theories of gender and the body -- more Butlerian -- than Butler's own critique of Merleau-Ponty.

One would expect that a collection reconsidering the legacy and work of Merleau-Ponty from a feminist perspective would have much to say about gender, about embodiment, and about flesh, that elusive amalgam through which Merleau-Ponty challenges the prevailing dualism of consciousness and object, and this collection does not disappoint on any of these counts. Olkowski writes: "Given the importance of Merleau-Ponty's contribution to the phenomenological idea of situated embodiment, every chapter in this volume, in some significant manner, reflects on what it means to be a spatially situated and embodied subject" (7). But what is most surprising is the expansiveness of the critiques collected here, in which neither Merleau-Ponty nor feminism are allowed to remain simple objects of thought. Questions of motherhood, sexuality and the body are raised alongside considerations of violence, race, politics, anonymity, terrorism and ethics; ethics in particular is a central concern of more than half of the contributions. This is an additional axis of rereading, since phenomenology in general and Merleau-Ponty in particular have long been accused of an ahistoricity that would preclude a serious ethics. But as Irigaray asserts in An Ethics of Sexual Difference, and Judith Butler echoes in her essay " Sexual Difference as a Question of Ethics," reckoning sexual difference is always an ethical project. The contributions by Judith Butler and Vicky Kirby address mutual intertwinement and reversibility in Irigaray's engagement with Merleau-Ponty, with Kirby asserting "Merleau-Ponty's double cross is an essential ingredient in the very possibility of a sexual ethics" (130). David Brubaker also reads the reversibility of Merleau-Ponty's flesh as grounding an ethic, in his case the ethic of care offered by Carol Gilligan. Ann Murphy reads Merleau-Ponty alongside the ethical philosophy of Levinas, asking if is it possible "to render his ontology politically or ethically viable." The routine dismissal of Merleau-Ponty as an ethical thinker because of a failure to adequately engage with alterity -- Levinas charges Merleau-Ponty with not being attentive to the otherness of the Other, while Irigaray charges that Merleau-Ponty totalizes and universalizes the other -- means that this is not a question that is asked of Merleau-Ponty often enough. Murphy and the other contributors arguing for an ethical reading of Merleau-Ponty convincingly make the case that it should be.

The essays are thoughtfully sequenced, though the book's organization would have benefitted from grouping them into thematic sections: a "Violence" section, for example, encompassing Gail Weiss's "Urban Flesh," in which she argues for a Merleau-Pontian politics of dwelling and spaciality in reading the landscape of post 9/11 America, next to Laura Doyle's "Bodies Inside/Out: Violation and Resistance from the Prison Cell to The Bluest Eye" and Jorella Andrews' "Vision, Violence and the Other." I also found myself wishing that the contributions had been longer, which would have allowed some of the arguments to unfold more slowly. As a whole, this collection evidences a deep and considered engagement with the existing feminist criticism of Merleau-Ponty while at the same time demonstrating the ways it might go further still. As one of the coeditors, Gail Weiss, puts it in her essay "Urban Flesh":

By bringing Merleau-Ponty into a conversation with his future interlocutors, including contemporary phenomenologists, and feminist theorists whose interests and commitments are not only different but also often at odds with his own, new spaces of possibility emerge, and new limitations must continually be confronted. (163)

This volume is the emergence of just such a new space of possibility.