Feminist Interpretations of Richard Rorty

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Marianne Janack (ed.), Feminist Interpretations of Richard Rorty, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2010, 227pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780271036298.

Reviewed by Elizabeth A. Sperry, William Jewell College


(A) It is objectively true that women should not be oppressed.

(B) We must work to overcome the oppression of women.

Are A and B opposed? These claims undeniably represent a difference in emphasis, one seeking to describe reality and the other to alter it. But if feminist progress is best obtained on a non-foundationalist approach to truth, the difference between A and B is substantial. Richard Rorty argued that neo-pragmatism better advanced feminism's aims than did representationalist philosophical approaches, and Marianne Janack has collected ten essays that examine the import of those arguments.

Feminist Interpretations of Richard Rorty presents four previously published articles and six newly seeing print, two of the latter by communications scholars rather than philosophers. Collections of this sort offer readers easy access to multiple papers discussing a central theme. The editor can arrange the essays so that readers encounter an unfolding conversation, later papers responding to those proceeding. Readers interested in the intersection of feminism and neo-pragmatism will appreciate this volume: one package, ten perspectives on a shared topic, all ordered to facilitate interpretation. The volume's usefulness withstands its few shortcomings, including a weakly reasoned and less relevant essay (the last), and another that nestles thoughtful arguments within a ramble of words. Yet these imperfections do not seriously mar the overall value of the collection. This volume is a fine addition to the "Feminist Interpretations" series.

The first chapter, following a helpful editor's introduction, reprints Rorty's "Feminism and Pragmatism." Here Rorty shows his persuasion chops, opening with a quotation from Catherine MacKinnon, whose claims he then presents as his own. Who can doubt Rorty's feminist sincerity when his guides are MacKinnon, Marilyn Frye, and Adrienne Rich? MacKinnon urges female judges to "use the tools of law as women, for all women" (19), which Rorty claims as a call to improve the position of women and to do so without consideration of any pre-existing objective truth that women are full human persons.

As Rorty frankly admits, universalism has advantages he cannot claim: not only can a universalist feminism present itself as absolutely true, but it also avoids the charges of "relativism, irrationalism and power-worship" (26) with which Rorty must contend. But he nevertheless believes pragmatism holds the upper hand, because it avoids presenting the intrinsic nature of "women's experience" (26) and because it doggedly pursues social change rather than abstract niceties. Empty arguments about the falsity of people's beliefs do nothing to improve the future.

The second article is a reprint of Nancy Fraser's "From Irony to Prophecy to Politics," an explicit response to the previous essay. Fraser notes that the cost of recasting feminists as prophets is that prophets are not philosophers. Clearly, though, Rorty has learned from feminist philosophers, Fraser says. Feminist critics argued that Rorty's use of a private/public dichotomy falsified human experience as well as the nature of exploitation. The private and the public are inseparably intertwined in our lives and in our struggles with oppression. Rorty no longer invokes the distinction; yet it dimly persists in his call to prophecy, where Rorty portrays feminism as individualistic and aesthetic, rather than collective and political. A feminist prophet would be a "solitary eccentric or member of a small embattled separatist club," when, as Fraser says, feminists "constitute a large, heterogeneous social movement with a presence in virtually every corner of American life" (51). Prophets can be authoritarian, but the socially shared work of consciousness-raising is not. Feminist progress originates with groups of women jointly reconceptualizing their experience.

In "Feminism and Pragmatism: A Reply to Richard Rorty," Sabina Lovibond argues that Rorty has overlooked a third option between his neo-pragmatism and the absolutist realism he rejects. Lovibond agrees that absolutist, transcendental foundations for knowledge and truth are unnecessary, but argues that both Rorty and feminism would be better served by a non-absolutist realism. She contends that Rorty's rejection of this middle option pushes his account toward demagoguery.

Lovibond favors a realism in which beliefs are made true, not by mirroring the intrinsic nature of entities, but instead by obeying language rules that specify the conditions making it acceptable to say "X is Y." Thus we retain the distinction between appearance and reality, and with it our ability "to say how things are irrespective of whether or not they are currently believed to be so" (64, emphasis Lovibond's). This language-rule-based realism enables a delineation of the social world that accords with feminist insight. For instance, sexual harassment, as Lovibond notes, is a feature of many women's social experience, even if that truth is one "which the gender system tends to prevent us from perceiving clearly" (65). Unfortunately, Rorty's abandonment of realism leaves those in power to establish the "truth" without regard for rational acceptability. He thus "encourages a vision of language as a medium of play and trickery rather than of communication, and a tendency to rejoice in the untruthful -- even 'deceptive' -- character of speech in general" (60).

John C. Adams' "Hope, Truth, and Rhetoric: Prophecy and Pragmatism in the Service of Feminism's Cause" defends Rorty against Lovibond. Adams asks

what prompts a plan's adoption? Truth? Yes and no. Lies? Yes and no. Facts? Yes and no. Reason? Yes and no. Possibilities? Yes and no. Probabilities? Yes and no. Emotions? Yes and no. Character? Yes and no. Trust? Yes and no. (80-1)

Readers who can dig beneath the verbiage will find Adams arguing that all philosophy reduces to rhetoric -- to persuasion -- and that Lovibond cannot escape this fact by attempting to ground feminist truths in linguistic naturalism. Rorty, just as Lovibond, seeks a source of legitimation for true discourses not currently accepted as true; and having eschewed philosophical realisms, he finds that source in prophecy. Hence Rorty does not, in fact, advocate mere acceptance of majority opinion: an important function of prophecy is to voice unpopular opinion and to pass it forward to a time when it might become more widely accepted.

Lovibond's distaste for rhetoric, Adams argues, leads her to ignore her own reliance on persuasion. Philosophers' use of persuasion is not accidental but necessary, because "the truth does not speak for itself" (83). Feminism also requires rhetoric: the only way to end oppression through peaceful means is to engage in effective persuasion. Any feminist theory or philosophical argumentation that claims not to engage primarily in persuasion is "in denial" (101).

The fifth chapter reprints Rorty's "Feminism, Ideology, and Deconstruction: A Pragmatist View." Although written before the paper that precedes it in this text, Rorty's essay can be seen as an amplification of Adams' points. Rorty's primary concern throughout is to explain the importance and nature of effective persuasion. He contends that "the most efficient way to expose or demystify an existing practice would seem to be by suggesting an alternative practice, rather than criticizing the current one" (104). Our minds and practices are changed by envisioning a better world and not by criticizing current circumstances. Besides, "proving" masculinism false will not dislodge it: "Masculinism is a much bigger and fiercer monster" (109) than our little philosophical problems. We must turn instead to persuasion, prophecy, and the adoption of alternative practices.

Georgia Warnke's "Democracy and Interpretation" locates persuasion midway between Habermas and Rorty. While Rorty is right that we can never transcend our own interpretive context, Habermas is also right to say that we try. "The reasons that show why gold is not soluble in hydrochloric acid or why killing is or is not ever morally justified are not just reasons for us but reasons for anyone" (117), Warnke writes. Hermeneutics brings these two approaches together. In some cases hermeneutic analysis demonstrates that competing interpretations are equally reasonable. This approach has social and political utility when applied to, for example, the abortion debate. We ought not to conclude that only one way of interpreting abortion makes sense, any more than we conclude "that Othello is about jealousy and therefore not about race or evil" (122). Less often appreciated, however, is the potential for hermeneutics to rule certain interpretations out. Some ways of making sense of a text -- or of a social/political situation -- are deeply flawed. For instance, marriage in the United States is historically a union between two free choosers, and it is hermeneutically implausible to block such choosing based on race, gender, or sex. Thus we can make well-grounded distinctions even without reliance on objective truth.

Linda Martín Alcoff's essay assesses the importance of representationalism for feminism. Feminist theory aims at actual truth and not just social progress, which Rorty's neo-pragmatism cannot supply because of its "severe deflation of truth" (133). Rorty considers language "better" not when it better represents reality, but when it better eliminates cruelty and suffering. But Alcoff argues that Rorty's preferred criteria do not function well without a representational basis: concerning cruelty, "What counts as a purposeful and unnecessary infliction of pain? Circumcision? … In other words, what some identify as instances of cruelty are seen by others as the mere appearance of cruelty resulting from faulty and biased descriptions" (141). Distinguishing between cruelty and non-cruelty seems to require a pre-existing representational backdrop. Yet Rorty's account will not allow, for example, victims of sexual assault to claim that those words better represent their experience than a language in which "sexual assault" cannot be conceptualized: "the subjective interiority of the young sexual partner of the patriarch is simply not on the map of the language unless it is accepting of the social system" (142-3).

Sharyn Clough's "Drawing Battle Lines and Choosing Bedfellows: Rorty, Relativism, and Feminist Strategy" reminds readers of Rorty's Davidsonian naturalism. Davidson's non-metaphysical account of truth enables Rorty to hold, without contradiction, both that progressive beliefs are more true than non-progressive beliefs and that truth is whatever view "wins out" over its competitors. Davidsonian holism means there must be significant overlap between our justification practices and the practices of those with whom we share a planet. Otherwise we would not be able to recognize each other as communicating meaningfully. Concerning the "survivors" of our current social and political battles, "it is impossible that their justification practices could be completely disconnected from the world in which they find themselves" (168). Even where false beliefs appear to triumph, "there is always the possibility, at least, that false beliefs can be objectively identified, and the causal history of those beliefs publicly retraced and evaluated, no matter who it is who holds the beliefs in question" (168, emphasis Clough's).

Stephen R. Yarbrough's "Richard Rorty, Feminism, and the Annoyances of Pragmatism" argues that Rorty's rhetorical orientation requires clarification. Absent this clarification, it is too easy to misread Rorty as, for instance, Sabina Lovibond has done. Yarbrough's point turns on the distinction between social constructionism and social interactionism. In social constructionism, language is an intermediary between the mind and the world, and language users communicate effectively only if they share the same medium. In social interactionism, however, "the constitution of both the objects of discourse and the meanings of words referring to them occurs simultaneously as human beings interact with things with words" (177-8). Which view does Rorty hold? Yarbrough claims that although Rorty "denies any affiliation with social constructionism" (178), he often presents himself in social constructionist terms. This is why his work is so often misinterpreted.

A social interactionist will emphasize -- as Rorty sometimes does -- the role of our practices in constituting our understandings and our experiences. This focus on practice then enables an analysis of our emotional response to practices and the role of our emotions in the meanings associated with those practices. Hence progress beyond masculinism does not require changing language as a medium; it requires instead changing our attitudes, and emotions, so that our linguistic interactions and practices are changed. Prophecy is feminism's best bet, but that only becomes clear on a social interactionist analysis.

The volume closes with Alessandra Tanesini's "Naturalism and Normativity," which attempts a different take on the question of normative grounding. Tanesini uses the work of Karen Barad to oppose Rorty. Rorty denies that the natural world contains its own intrinsic norms, but Tanesini contends that "meanings and values can be found in nature itself" (213). Tanesini explains that for Barad, "nature is constituted by phenomena that are patterns of normative significance and materialization" (210). Tanesini's case against Rorty's understanding of normativity, and in favor of the natural world as intrinsically normative, consists in describing ideas from Karen Barad's work. It is "apparent, thanks to Barad's work, that there is nothing obligatory in [Rorty's view]." (213). Readers might have liked to see an argument for Barad's work, rather than a depiction of it; and an argument for preferring Barad's orientation to Rorty's, rather than an itemization of conflicting conclusions. The connection between normative naturalism and feminist philosophy is not so clear that further explanation is unnecessary. For centuries, normative naturalists claimed that since women are inferior to men, they ought to be relegated to the home, there to bear children in accord with their biological destiny. But Tanesini shows no awareness of feminists' well-grounded antipathy to normative naturalism. Nor does she explain how her normative naturalism advances feminism's cause or has anything to offer feminism at all. If nature contains its own "meanings and values," what role do these have in ending women's oppression?

Despite the problems of the final essay, Feminist Interpretations of Richard Rorty is a handy and well-structured resource. Above all, it serves as a reminder of the difficulty of determining whether feminism requires a grounding in absolute truth and of the broader significance for everyday life of supposedly narrow debates in theoretical philosophy.