Fichte's Ethical Thought

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Allen W. Wood, Fichte's Ethical Thought, Oxford University Press, 2016, 321 pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198766889.

Reviewed by Michael Baur, Fordham University


This is the third of three books Allen Wood has written on ethical thought in the tradition of German Idealism. The other two -- Hegel's Ethical Thought (1990) and Kant's Ethical Thought (1999) -- focus on two thinkers often understood to represent the starting-point and the ending-point of German Idealism. Wood's aim in this third book is to show that Fichte is not just one more philosopher among others in a neatly-defined tradition known as German Idealism, and, more emphatically, that Fichte's thought cannot be adequately understood if it is characterized merely as a way station on a philosophical path that leads more-or-less directly from Kant to Hegel. By the end, Wood has told us enough to make genuinely serious and challenging the question: "Would the community of philosophers have done better to consider Fichte, rather than Kant, Hegel, or someone else, the most important philosopher of the past two centuries?" Wood's official response is: "We will never know." (p. 292) But there is little doubt that Wood leans strongly in favor of an affirmative answer. There is a good reason, he suggests, for why he spent more time writing this book than he did in writing the other two combined.

What emerges in the book is an overall message that might be expressed in four main theses about Fichte's philosophical and ethical thought: (1) it is more defensible than has typically been acknowledged; (2) it has been unjustifiably neglected and inadequately understood; (3) it has much to teach us about our own vocation as human beings; and (4) its influence on subsequent philosophical thinkers and movements has been much more profound and much further-reaching than has been recognized. Wood goes so far as to assert that "Fichte is the most influential single figure in the entire tradition of continental European philosophy in the last two centuries" (p. ix). If the second and fourth thesis seem to be incompatible, then Wood's answer, it seems, would be that it is possible for one philosopher to have exercised a profound influence on later philosophers, even though these later philosophers failed to recognize and/or failed to understand the actual views of the original thinker that influenced them. Wood invites readers to take seriously his seemingly outlandish claim about Fichte's far-reaching influence, by proposing the following hypothetical test:

You pick any major figure in the continental philosophical tradition, and I will identify an idea (sometimes several ideas) that you will agree is absolutely central to that philosopher's thought -- even constituting one of that philosopher's chief contributions. Then I can show you that the original author of that idea is Fichte. (p. ix)

Wood does not attempt to demonstrate, on a case-by-case basis, how Fichte's philosophy directly influenced this or that later continental thinker; but he does more than enough to lay the groundwork which would enable such a case-by-case demonstration. And it is a small step from his general groundwork-laying to the concrete realization that many of Fichte's original innovations in philosophy really do get reprised in the subsequent work of very many later continental philosophers.

Biographical stage-setting is fitting in any book that seeks to elucidate the ethical worldview of a significant philosophical thinker, but it is especially fitting in the case of a philosopher like Fichte, who famously observed that "The kind of philosophy one chooses depends on the kind of person one is" (p. x). Wood covers key moments in Fichte's life-story (e.g., his birth into severe poverty, his unlikely rise to prominence, the development of his never-completed system of philosophy or Wissenschaftslehre, his arrogant and impolitic response to the charge of atheism, and his 1799 dismissal from the University of Jena which effectively ended his most productive years as a philosopher). He rightly notes that Fichte's life was much like the life of a tragic hero (p. 1). Admirably, Fichte refused to separate his vocation as a philosopher from his vocation as a human being, but, self-defeatingly, Fichte was often as uncompromising in his relations with others as he was in spelling out the revolutionary implications of his philosophy.

Wood argues that if we are to understand Fichte aright, it is important to see that he is not the kind of subjective idealist that Jacobi, Schelling, and Hegel (among others) allegedly accused him of being. For Wood, Fichte's version of transcendental philosophy does not seek to undermine or discredit common sense "realism," but instead seeks to provide a justification for it that common sense realism cannot provide for itself (p. 31). For Wood, one must properly distinguish Fichte's transcendental approach to philosophy from metaphysical or representationalist approaches. The latter ask whether and how it is possible to for us to represent reality as it is in itself, while the former approach does not (p. 33). The crucial question for Fichte's transcendental philosophy is: "How do we combine what we think about the world with what we must think about our own activity in knowing and acting on it, in order to make our conception of the world coherent with our conception of our activity?" (p. 33) As Wood points out, Fichte's answer involves, among other things, an argument to the effect that the otherness of the world (its non-reducibility to our own thought or consciousness) is a transcendentally necessary condition (that is, not just a logically or psychologically necessary condition) of consciousness itself (p. 34) or, to express the same point in Fichtean terminology, the positing of the not-I is a necessary condition of the I's own self-positing (p. 61). As Wood explains, Fichte's rejection of Kant's thing-in-itself is not a rejection of the lived realism of common sense, but rather a rejection of metaphysical speculation altogether, regardless of whether such speculation ends up affirming a form of realism or idealism.

Wood goes on to show how Fichte's account of intersubjectivity can be understood as an extension of his argument that the positing of the not-I is a transcendentally necessary condition of the I's own self-positing. The point of Fichte's deduction of intersubjectivity is that this transcendentally necessary not-I cannot be a mere piece of nature but must be another (self-positing) I. Fundamental to Fichte's argument is the claim that one cannot, with self-consistency, regard oneself as having come to reach a reason-based understanding or judgment about something, if one does not also regard oneself as free. Thus:

If I were mistaken in believing at t1 that my judging was genuinely contingent, dependent on the course of my thinking -- if it were not truly open to me at t1 to make any of several possible judgments about the cause of A -- then the judgment I do eventually make at t2 about this cause could not possibly be a genuine case of my coming to understand or comprehend A. It could at best be some sort of reliably determined illusion that I understand. (p. 80)

As Wood rightly notes, Fichte's aim here is not to demonstrate the reality of freedom (for that sort of aim would amount to a dogmatic attempt to discern what is the case about reality as it is in itself), but only to show that freedom is presupposed by any claim to understand or to judge on the basis of reasons. Furthermore, the freedom that is thus presupposed in all understanding and judging involves a transition from indeterminacy to determinacy (a transition from a state of wavering in the face of contingent possibilities about which one might make a judgment or an epistemic commitment, to a state of actually judging or actually making an epistemic commitment). If we are to understand the transcendental conditions under which this sort of uncoerced transition from indeterminacy to determinacy takes place for the I, we must understand how the I is non-empirically related to the object, or the world, upon which its own activity as an I is directed.

For Fichte, as Wood rightly notes, every act of the I is related to some object (some not-I) which counts for the I as something external to it and thus as something that constrains or limits it. If the I were not thus related to a not-I, then the I would not be the finite I that it is, in which case it would not be an I at all; for, according to Fichte, the only kind of I that is conceivable is finite. (Fichte's point is that an infinite I would be an unbounded activity that is not directed upon any object whatsoever, in which case it would not be a conscious I, and thus not an I at all). As Wood further explains, it is tempting to argue that the object (or not-I) upon which the I's activity is directed is something that is already present -- something that already exists -- for the I, which can thereby count as a limit or constraint upon the I. But as Wood shows, to argue in this way would be to argue in a vicious circle. There is a vicious circle here (although Wood does not explain it precisely in this way) since the question at hand is the question of how the uncoerced transition from indeterminacy to determinacy takes place for the I; thus it is the question of how a present or an existing object comes to make an appearance to the I (comes to be adjudged or to count as a presently-existing object for the I) in the first place.

Wood goes on to explain that an adequate answer to this question will succeed in showing how what counts for the I as an object of, or constraint upon, its present activity is not, in fact, something that is actually already present, but rather something that counts as what is yet to be done. And just as the object (or the not-I) which fundamentally (transcendentally and not empirically) limits or constrains the I's activity (i.e., renders it finite) is not to be construed as anything that is actually already present (i.e., already present apart from the I's own activity), so too the I's own activity is itself not to be construed as anything that is already active apart from the limiting or constraining role played by the I's object (or not-I). Now for Fichte, as Wood rightly explains, the only kind of object (or not-I) which allows the I coherently to posit (to be aware of) a constraint upon its activity while also synthetically uniting (or, one might say, necessarily connecting) this being-constrained with its very own free and uncoerced activity as an I, is another I. And so, according to Fichte's further argumentation (which Wood does not fully elaborate here), it is possible to give a fully coherent account of the I's theoretical awareness of objects and how such object-awareness is compatible with the I's awareness of its own freedom, only if one also accepts that there are two or more mutually summoning and summoned I's, i.e., two or more I's that mutually determine one another to be self-determining. Thus Fichte sought to complete Kant's transcendental philosophy by illuminating the problem of intersubjectivity precisely as a transcendental problem: a transcendentally necessary condition of the I's theoretical object-consciousness is its practical/moral/juridical consciousness of other I's outside of itself.

The remainder of this book can be understood as the further working-out of two key ideas already touched upon: (a) that the I is an absolutely free act (not a thing or a substance), and thus is utterly uncaused or uncoerced by anything (not even by a "self"- thing; p. 67) that can be construed as something present to it; and (b) that the absolutely free I is inescapably answerable to or subject to a certain kind of constraint, and thus is inescapably finite and intersubjectively engaged to the core of its being. Only if one understands these two ideas, Wood suggests, will one be able understand how "Fichte's ethics is both radically individualist and radically collectivist" (p. 101).  It is crucial, however, that one understand these two ideas in their essential unity, for Fichte's ethics "is at its most radical in insisting that individualism and collectivism must not be separated from one another or seen as rival values." (p. 101).

Wood openly admits that understanding Fichte can be hard going (p. 117). He also suggests (though he does not say so explicitly) that a full understanding of Fichte's radical account of freedom and selfhood will require a re-thinking of concepts such as temporality and embodiment; for to understand Fichte is to understand that the Fichtean I exists "before it is anything determinate" (p. 69), it is in a state of "endless becoming" (p. 88), and it exists "as an object for itself" even though it also has "no nature that already determines it" (p. 116). Notwithstanding the difficulty of the argumentation and the counter-intuitive character of some of the claims, Wood is an exceedingly clear and well-informed expositor who succeeds in demonstrating the rigorousness as well as the contemporary relevance of Fichte's ethical thought. In discussing Fichte on moral authority, for example, Wood explains how, for Fichte, the moral law can be thought of as authoritative (i.e., it can be thought of as real or objectively constraining) only if it is also thought of as self-legislated; p. 132). Wood's discussion of moral authority leads him into a further discussion of why Fichte would disagree with contemporary philosophers who (like Bernard Williams) think of moral duties as representing side constraints; who buy into the notion of agent causation; who aim to develop a meta-ethics: or who remain impressed by the so-called dilemma of determinism (according to which no action is free, since an action is either causality necessitated -- thus unfree -- or else it is random or arbitrary -- thus once again unfree).

Wood's discussion of conscience leads the reader from the basic concept of moral authority to the applicability of that concept. Crucially, Wood argues that Fichte's doctrine of conscience is not a doctrine about the content of the moral judgments that one ought to make (for one's particular moral judgments are always fallible), but rather a doctrine about how, and with what attitude (an attitude of conviction), a moral agent ought to act in the face of such (otherwise paralyzing) fallibility. Against Michelle Kosch, Wood argues (rightly, I think) that the fundamental principle of morality in Fichte's thought is not a material or a calculative-consequentialist principle that requires agents to pursue substantive moral ends. Wood goes on to argue (less convincingly, I think) that it is precisely because Fichte's moral principle is formal and not material (deontic and not calculative-consequentialist) that it is wrong to hold (as Hegel does) that Fichtean morality involves a kind of Verstellung, or dishonest shiftiness.

Wood further defends Fichte against Hegel by saying that for Fichte -- but not for Hegel -- it is possible for a person to have made a mistaken moral judgment but nevertheless acted rightly insofar as he/she followed his/her conscientious conviction. According to Wood, the problem with Hegel is that he held that "conscience is valid only when the moral judgment is also objectively correct," and so Hegel (unlike Fichte) "does not seem to allow that there could be a mistaken moral judgment that is conscientious and not hypocritical" (p. 167). Wood concludes that Hegel's view (expressed in the Phenomenology) that hypocrisy cannot be avoided but must instead be transcended through religious forgiveness is really just a way of side-stepping, rather than addressing, the really tough problem that Fichte confronts head-on (namely, the problem of how, and with what attitude, a moral agent ought to act when no infallible moral judgments are possible).

In his discussion of the self-sufficiency of reason, Wood makes the important point that the I's striving for absolute independence and self-sufficiency is not a striving to maximize something about which the I possesses a definite conception, but is rather a striving towards what can never be actually realized (after all, for Fichte, a transcendentally necessary condition of the I's free activity is that such activity be opposed by the contrary activity of a not-I). He further shows how, for Fichte, the drive towards the self-sufficiency of reason generates an antinomy which can be resolved only if one assumes that "all free beings necessarily share the same end" (p. 203). But even as moral agents (in order to be self-consistent) must provisionally assume that all human ends are implicitly in agreement with one another, these moral agents must also continue to interact and communicate with one another for the purpose of bringing about the actual agreement of all human ends. Wood goes on to argue that Fichte's account of humanity's vocation and the social unity of reason anticipates the theories of communicative action, discourse ethics, and eventual agreement put forward by later thinkers such as Jürgen Habermas, Karl-Otto Apel, and Charles Sanders Peirce.

Wood's final chapter is dedicated to showing how Fichte's ethical thought is related to, though quite distinct from, his theory of right, including his theory of law, property, political legitimacy, economic justice, punishment, the state's use of coercion, the rights of women, and the right to revolution. Since the vocation of all human beings is to strive towards bringing about the complete (though never fully attainable) agreement of all human ends, the aim of all government should be to serve as an instrument of such complete agreement and thus to make itself -- per impossibile -- wholly superfluous as government. Along the way, Wood makes a strong case for the view that Fichte, in spite of being a child of his time, offers a legal/political worldview whose foundations and implications are much more reasonable and more progressive than is commonly thought.

In general, this book is well-researched, well-argued, clearly-written, and full of richly suggestive ideas; it is just as rigorous an exercise in the history of philosophy as it is in substantive philosophical argumentation. If it is deficient in any way, I would say that the deficiency consists in Wood's tendency to oversimplify the relation between Fichte and Hegel when engaged in the (undoubtedly necessary and admirable) task of rehabilitating Fichte's legacy. For example, it is possible that Hegel's discussion of hypocrisy in the Phenomenology is not (pace Wood) a sign that Hegel side-stepped the tough issue that Fichte straightforwardly addressed, but instead a sign that Hegel so well understood the issue that he sought to address it in a rather different and unexpected way. For arguably, the hypocrisy about which Hegel speaks has to do not so much with the agent's making of incorrect moral judgements, but rather with the agent's disavowing of all responsibility for having made moral judgments which turn out to be incorrect and which -- counterintuitively -- the agent could not have rationally avoided making in the first place. If Hegel is right to imply that an agent's present responsibility can extend even to actions which seemingly belong to the agent's (over-and-done-with) past or to the agent's merely embodied (not-yet-rational) existence, then perhaps Hegel's point is that we have to re-think the concepts of temporality and embodiment even more radically (more non-individualistically and more tragically) than Wood (in following Fichte) suggests we must. But this is not a complaint about Wood's book per se: it is a truly excellent book on Fichte. Rather, it is an observation that the book does not do full justice to the very complex and philosophically rich relation between Fichte and Hegel -- and that is a limitation which Wood could not have been expected to avoid in the first place.