Fichte's Ethics

Placeholder book cover

Michelle Kosch, Fichte's Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2018, 208pp., $54.00, ISBN 9780198809661.

Reviewed by Gabriel Gottlieb, Xavier University


In a devastating review of A. E. Kroeger's 1897 translation of J. G. Fichte's Sittenlehre (inaccurately translated as the Science of Ethics), G. E. Moore claims that it "contains the most thoroughgoing attempt ever made to build a complete ethical system solely on the basis of freedom."[1] While Moore's criticisms in the review largely concern matters of translation (mistranslations, omissions, etc.), he is not exactly sympathetic to Fichte's overall ethical system. Moore concludes the review by noting that Fichte "fails us entirely" by not specifying what our duty actually is, even if he successfully shows "that something must be our duty."[2] Moore's fundamental criticism is that Fichte's ethics is too abstract or formal, and thereby, incapable of issuing concrete duties ("what that something is" we must do), a familiar criticism of moral philosophy played in the Kantian key.[3] Fichte's Sittenlehre, more accurately translated as The System of Ethics in the 2005 Cambridge translation by Daniel Breazeale and Günter Zöller, might still be "the most thoroughgoing attempt" to ground our ethical duties on a conception of freedom, yet pace Moore (among others), Fichte does offer a view on what our substantive moral duties are as rational agents.

One of the many virtues of Michelle Kosch's provocative, tightly-argued, and insightful book is that she clearly establishes what, for Fichte, our moral duties consist in, if we are to take his conception of freedom, understood as absolute independence or self-sufficiency, as our guide. Kosch even remarks that one of her aims is to end the "neglect of Fichte's substantive normative ethics" (38). By doing so she hopes to not only fill "an astonishing gap" in the literature, but to also introduce Fichte's ethical views to the "mainstream" of contemporary ethics (178). Contemporary ethicists, from both Kantian and consequentialist standpoints, will gain much from her monograph regardless of their familiarity with Fichte's philosophy; so too will scholars of German Idealism and Fichte, even those who are already familiar with her previously published essays on Fichte's ethics, parts of which are incorporated into some of the book's chapters. Fichte's Ethics is not a collection of essays, but a highly original and controversial interpretation of Fichte's ethical thought that seamlessly incorporates previously published and new material into a unified interpretive argument. Kosch presents a novel defense of a central thesis of Fichte's practical philosophy: independence is a constitutive end of rational agency. The upshot of this view, Kosch argues, is that if one takes independence (autonomy or self-sufficiency) as the constitutive end of rational action, and if the limits placed on us by nature can be overcome through the sound application of our knowledge, one is "thereby committed to the value of basic research and the development of autonomy-enhancing technologies". Such a neo-Baconian view is not currently a "prominent one in the mainstream of contemporary ethics," yet it justifies education and research in the arts and sciences (178).

The book consists of five chapters and a two-page conclusion that together offer a reconstruction of Fichte's normative ethics as developed primarily in his System of Ethics (1798), as well as related works form his Jena period, including his central work of legal and political philosophy, Foundations of Natural Right (1796/97). Chapter 1 provides an overview of the book's central claims and begins to distinguish Fichte's practical philosophy from Kant's, a theme Kosch returns to throughout the book. Chapter 2 develops an interpretation of Fichte's account of rational agency as a constitutive model of action that also endorses an instrumentalist picture of rationality in which rational agency involves selecting the means that maximize independence. Chapter 3 examines material independence, or 'what must happen' to arrive at or approximate absolute independence. The focus here is on the particular duties that follow from Fichte's views on rational agency and promote independence. Chapter 4 examines formal independence. The focus in this chapter is on how one must act to arrive at independence. Freedom requires not only that one carries out the right actions (material independence), but that those actions "come about in the right way" (formal independence) (128). Chapter 5 presents a powerful argument, rationally reconstructed from Fichte's Foundations of Natural Right and System of Ethics, in which Kosch concludes that independence is, indeed, the constitutive end of action and that Kantians must admit as much. The ultimate conclusion of the argument is that agents are rationally required "to obtain or maintain an environment secured against intervention by unpredictable, powerful forces," whether those forces are natural or social (159). According to Kosch, for anyone worried about the negative environmental implications of such a view, when the view is appreciated in full, it should be evident that Fichte "can offer stronger arguments for environmental conservation than other Kantians or indeed most consequentialists" (172). In the following, I review some of Kosch's central claims and arguments, as well as some potential objections. Her book is dense with arguments and new interpretive claims; I will place to the side a number of important and distinctive claims to focus on the book's main interpretive thread.

For Kosch, "independence" or "self-sufficiency" is the "substantive end toward which moral action is directed in Fichte's normative ethics" (2). The principle of morality, Fichte argues, "is the necessary thought of the intelligence that it ought to determine its freedom in accordance with the concept of self-sufficiency, absolutely without exception" (IV: 59). Fichte is not always forthcoming about what he means by independence or self-sufficiency, and there is some debate about whether these terms can be clarified sufficiently to serve as a normative end.[4] In response, Kosch points out that all Fichte needs is a claim about what "counts as more or less independence" (44). To clarify the meaning of independence, Fichte sets a formal and material condition on independence. According to the formal condition, independence is the perfection of one's ability to set ends spontaneously "through the activity of rational reflection" (153). Setting ends based on authority, desire alone, or the weight of tradition undermines formal independence. Independence in the material sense refers to maximal independence from the interference of other rational beings and nature, a conception of independence that requires rational control over one's surroundings. Fichte acknowledges that as finite beings we will never fully attain this end, yet we are obligated to strive to bring about those actions that are, as Kosch explains, "part of the series of actions at whose limit one would arrive at the state of absolute freedom from all limitation" (39). Kosch endorses material independence as a relevant, but overlooked option for contemporary normative ethics.

There is little doubt that Fichte is a Kantian. He often claims, in one way or another, that his philosophy expresses the spirit of Kant's, even if it departs from the letter. Given the association of Kantian moral philosophy with deontology, it should come as no surprise to find interpretations of Fichte's ethics that emphasize its deontological dimensions. Allen Wood, for instance, has recently suggested that there may be no one "in the entire history of ethics who is more radically committed to deontology than Fichte."[5] Kosch certainly disagrees. A central thesis of her work is that Fichte's normative ethics is teleological. Following David Cummiskey's distinction between foundational consequentialism and normative consequentialism, Kosch argues that Fichte is a normative consequentialist.[6] This means that the basic structure of his normative principle has a consequentialist structure, since, on her view, the principle promotes the good of independence without appealing to agent-centered constraints (such as Nozickan side-constraints) or the priority of basic negative or positive duties (52). She does not attribute a justifying or foundational consequentialism to Fichte, a view in which, as Cummiseky explains, "the goodness of ends justifies the normative principle."[7] Kosch largely places to the side an examination of the foundations of Fichte's ethics.

Alongside Fichte's normative consequentialism, Kosch attributes to him a calculative and maximalist model of practical deliberation. If the constitutive end of rational agency is independence, then the purpose of practical deliberation is to calculate the specific means that will maximally further independence. Calculative reasoning, as Kosch uses the term, is "means-end or part-whole reasoning" (17). Calculative reasoning is essential to determining morally right actions, since actions are moral insofar as they maximize independence. Fichte argues that there are no morally indifferent actions, so there will always be a moral means, or one determinate action that maximizes independence. Fichte, however, does not himself employ a calculus or use explicitly calculative language. What Fichte calls "technically practical" reasoning best approximates Kosch's calculative reasoning. Technically practical reasoning involves finding the means to an end given to reason by something outside of reason such as a natural needs or one's arbitrary will (IV: 57). He contrasts it with "absolutely practical" reasoning, the activity of reason when it "sets itself an end purely and simply by and through itself" (Ibid.). One reasons practically in the absolute sense when one determines through reason alone that independence or self-sufficiency constitutes one's ultimate end. This case of absolute practical reasoning is not calculative, as reason is attentive only to the end.

Kosch appears to hold that technical-practical reasoning and absolute-practical reasoning make up two distinct steps in reasoning about action, only one of which, it seems on her view, essentially belongs to the process of practical deliberation. This is evident when she claims that "practical deliberation is entirely calculative for Fichte" (18). Kosch's analysis of practical deliberation, then, excludes absolute practical reasoning. This exclusion allows her to place greater emphasis on instrumental reasoning, thereby leaving behind, unfortunately, an analysis of absolute-practical reasoning's setting in and through reason alone the required end of self-sufficiency. As a result, the process of coming to determine for oneself that independence is one's own end (an end commanded by reason) is not examined in detail by Kosch, yet Fichte's System of Ethics takes this to be a central aspect of the reasoning involved in practical deliberation. Fichte even warns that "anyone who fails to recognize this absoluteness . . . and considers reason to be nothing more than a mere power of ratiocination, which can be set in motion only if objects are first given to it from outside, will always find it incomprehensible how reason can be absolutely practical" (IV: 58).

If Kosch is right to emphasize the calculative dimension of practical deliberation, one might expect this not to be at the cost of the absolute dimension of practical deliberation. One reason the importance of absolute practical reason is muted in Fichte's Ethics might be a result of Kosch's decision not to reconstruct Fichte's deduction of the moral principle or how the principle arises in consciousness of moral subjects as a normative and action-guiding constraint. A greater emphasis on the absolute dimension of practical reason might reveal grounds to be cautious about jettisoning the deontological reading. I suspect defenders of Fichte's deontology will be dissatisfied by the absence of a more thorough engagement with the view (she does briefly criticize Wood's reading); one might wonder why she does not consider a potential compromise between a teleological and deontological reading.[8] It is reasonable to think that a normative ethics in which reason demands independence and prohibits actions opposed to independence is deontological in some respect.

In Chapter 3, Kosch devotes ample space to outlining the types of duties that lead to independence. She classifies duties by what they cultivate and preserve: physical powers, intellectual powers, and individuality. Since material independence is our rational goal and is achieved in part by technical mastery, it follows that we have a duty to cultivate the body, develop skills that promote our causal efficacy, and generally preserve our physical being. Additionally, we have duties regarding the protection and cultivation of property, since "it is a condition and tool of freedom" (IV: 298). As Kosch notes, Fichte holds that there is a moral duty "to ensure . . . that every mature rational being has property sufficient to maintain himself" (69). Promoting conscientiousness and the formation of true beliefs are examples of moral duties of intellect. In terms of duties of individuality, while Fichte does not derive the concept of right from the moral law (as some of his contemporaries attempted to do), he does hold that we have a moral duty to form and live within a society in which a system of individual rights is upheld, as this is a technique for promoting independence (IV: 234).

In her discussion of individuality, Kosch turns to an analysis of Fichte's Foundations of Natural Right where she offers an instrumentalist view of the normative foundations of Fichte's theory of right. A theory of right aims to solve a specific problem of coordination: how can space be divided among individuals in a way that provides room for their agency without interference (97). Solving the coordination problem is not possible from the moral standpoint, but requires some convention. For Fichte, the convention is articulated by the principle of right: each agent must limit its external freedom so that others can be externally free. One important difference between right and morality that Kosch highlights is that solving the coordination problem requires "strategic interaction," or an interaction that considers what others will do in determining what one ought to do, while moral agency is non-strategic (ibid.). The strategic interaction essential to Fichte's approach to solving the coordination problem is the summons, a call by one subject to another that demands the subject exercise its own free agency in response to the call. For Kosch, what it means to say that right is independent of morality (a thesis of Fichte's much discussed in the literature) is that strategic principles (right) cannot be derived from non-strategic principles (morality) (97-98). A rightful state offers a technique for solving the problem of social coordination and serves as a means toward independence. The instrumentalist view of the state, Kosch holds, explains why the principle of right has only hypothetical validity for Fichte and why its adoption is an arbitrary choice: if one wills the end of community, then one must will the means. Fichte claims that no absolute reason can be given for why one should adopt the principle of right (III: 89). However, from the moral standpoint, Fichte claims that it is "an absolute duty of conscience to unite with others in a state," which requires adopting the principle of right (IV: 238). Kosch explains that Fichte takes there to be overwhelming moral reasons for entering and remaining within the state, but could there not be an absolute reason in the form of the absolute duty of conscience to live in the state? How should these two claims be reconciled?[9]

In Chapter 4, Kosch defends an interpretation of Fichte's theory of moral conscience that cuts against the majority of readings present in the literature, thereby fixing what she sees as their common error. On Fichte's view, moral agency requires that one "do what conscience demands simply because it demands it. But conscience is the immediate consciousness of our determinate duty" (IV: 173). A corollary, for Fichte, is that "conscience never errs and cannot err" (IV: 174). Fichte appears to endorse the infallibility of conscience. Many interpreters see in Fichte's remarks about conscience a criterion of right and wrong (this is the common error): the correctness that x is my duty (a first-order judgment) is infallibly guaranteed by a second-order conviction reached through practical deliberation. One obvious problem with this view is that it makes the standard of morality entirely subjective. That the fallibility of moral conviction is a live option for Fichte is evident from the fact that he addresses the problem of moral disagreement, or how to resolve cases in which two agents have opposing moral convictions (132).

To counter the standard interpretation, Kosch points out two components of formal independence: (1) one must not act blindly or impulsively on one's duty but on the basis of some thoughtful reflection on one's duty that issues in a "sufficiently firm conviction" (129); and (2) that one is to act on that duty precisely because one holds it and not from some other motive. In other words, one must be conscientious and act from one's conscientiousness. This is what Fichte means when he says that we are to act on "what conscience demands because conscience demands it" (IV: 173). But, on what grounds, can one say that one's conviction is sufficiently firm? The problems of self-deception, bias, lack of evidence, or ideology are considerations that may weaken one's belief in the firmness of one's conviction. The question about the firmness of conviction should be distinguished from a second question concerning whether the action is, as a matter of fact, a means toward independence. There is, then, a concern about the subjective status of one's conviction and a question about the objective status of the action's relationship to the end of independence. Fallibility, Kosch argues, is an option regarding the objective status of the action's relationship to the end of independence. However, regarding the status of one's own conviction, whether it is firmly held or not, is a matter of the immediate and infallible consciousness that doubt about what is one's duty "is replaced by settled conviction" (136). The second-order, immediate and infallible consciousness of one's settled conviction does not determine that one's first-order judgment about duty is correct: infallibility is not transferred from the second-order to the first. Defenders of the standard interpretation might point out that Fichte does employ criteriological language about the correctness of one's conviction concerning duty. What I find wanting in Kosch's analysis is an account of what Fichte intends when he says "the absolute criterion" (a feeling of truth and certainty as Fichte puts it or a feeling that a settled conviction has replaced doubt as Kosch puts it), provides for the "correctness of our conviction concerning duty." The issue, when one attends to Fichte's talk about a criterion of correctness, is that Fichte does not appear to question "how one can be confident that one has indeed acquired a moral conviction," but rather according to what standard we are to assess the "correctness" of the conviction (135). He says after all that "a certain conviction must therefore be absolutely correct," not simply that we must be correct that we have a settled conviction (IV: 165).

There are many topics and arguments in Fichte's Ethics I have not assessed, including Kosch's rational reconstruction in Chapter 5 of Fichte's argument defending independence as a constitutive end. Kosch also examines Fichte's drive-based moral psychology, as well as his views on evil and reflective judgment. She also interestingly contrasts Fichte's views to those of Kant, Bentham, William Godwin, Heidegger, and Horkheimer and Adorno. Her remarks on these issues and figures are consistently enlightening. There are topics and issues Kosch, regrettably, chose not to examine such as the connection between Fichte's ethics and both his theory of self-consciousness and foundationalist theory of science (his Wissenschaftslehre). Fichte prided himself on founding his ethical and political philosophy on the principles of the Wissenschaftslehre. In fact, the full title of the principle work Kosch examines is The System of Ethics according to principles of the Wissenschaftslehre. Given Kosch's interpretative acumen, it would have been useful to know how she understands the relationship between the principles of the Wissenschaftslehre and Fichte's ethics. From a more critical standpoint, one might wonder whether his normative ethics remains Fichtean when divorced from the larger project of the Wissenschaftslehre.

With the publication of Kosch's book, Allen Wood's Fichte's Ethical ThoughtDaniel Breazeale's Thinking through the WissenschaftslehreThe Cambridge Companion to Fichte, as well as a volume I edited on Fichte's Foundations of Natural Rights, not to mention forthcoming edited volumes with Cambridge, Palgrave, and Bloomsbury, there is reason to think we are witnessing a Fichte renaissance. The hope of many of these books, Kosch's included, is to establish the philosophical significance of Fichte's philosophy. Kosch additionally aims to show its contemporary relevance. If you are willing to take an honest chance on Fichte, I suspect you will agree with Kosch -- Fichte's philosophy is significant and relevant. And, with the growth of secondary literature, the cost of entry is, perhaps, not as high, the task not as daunting. To conclude, Fichte's Ethics is highly recommended for its clarity and insight, as well as its potential to promote valuable debate about the nature of Fichte's ethics.


Many thanks to Tim Brownlee, James Clarke, Kristen Renzi and Owen Ware for helpful comments and discussion.


Cummiskey, David (1996), Kantian Consequentialism. New York: Oxford University Press.

Nance, Michael (2015), "Recognition, Freedom, and the Self in Fichte's Foundations of Natural Right," European Journal of Philosophy (23): 608-632.

Moore, G. E. (1898), "Review of Fichte's The Science of Ethics," Ethics (9): 92-97.

Ware, Owen (2018), "Fichte's Normative Ethics: Deontological or Teleological," Mind (506): 565-584.

Wood, Allen (2016), Fichte's Ethical Thought. New York: Oxford University Press.

[1] Moore 1898: 96.

[2] Ibid., 97.

[3] Ibid.

[4] See Wood 2016 and Ware 2018.

[5] Wood 2016: 149.

[6] Cummiskey 1996.

[7] Ibid., 8.

[8] Ware 2018 defends such a compromise.

[9] Nance 2015 addresses this issue.