Fiction and Art: Explorations in Contemporary Theory

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Ananta Ch. Sukla (ed.), Fiction and Art: Explorations in Contemporary Theory, Bloomsbury, 2015, 422pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781472575036.

Reviewed by Anders Pettersson, Umeå University


Apart from the editor's introduction and concluding note, this book contains 26 essays on a wide spectrum of subjects. The individual contributions are, on the whole, interesting and accessible; in some cases I find them excellent. That is all very much to Ananta Ch. Sukla's credit. At the same time, however, I cannot help thinking that his collection lacks focus.

In his introduction Sukla quotes with sympathy Samuel Johnson's remarks about literary fiction, according to which fiction has the ability to exhibit life in its true state, picking up representative individuals and circumstances and polishing these diamonds by art until they "display that lustre which before was buried among common stones" (p. 1). Sukla comes back to Johnson in his concluding note, which contains his most explicit explanation of how he himself thinks about fiction.

Dissection of fiction in terms of empirical truth value, semantic potency, fulfilment of religious, moral, social or any other biological requirements will always fail to attain the desired result. Even analyses of fiction in its etymological derivatives also fail. What seems more effective is, to some extent, the Johnsonian view of fiction as an antonym of (or contra) fact: a result of man's dissatisfaction with the facts of the phenomenal (actual) world. For a creative man the actual (natural) world is not the authority of existence, nor is man's logical view of this existence the only/final criterion of truth. Of course fiction is sometimes used in its etymological sense of feigning, pretending, make-believing, deceiving or even distorting, but that sense is only secondary. Its primary meaning is re-making (not making), re-shaping (not shaping), re-/trans-forming (not forming) the facts presented to him by nature. Fiction is man's own "perception", "understanding" and "interpretation" of the facts, completion of the facts that he visualizes as incomplete, and, even, endowment of truth to the facts that he considers wanting or mis-presented there by nature. Art is essentially a fiction in this sense, inclusive, perhaps, of all the definitions of art provided so far. (p. 389)

Space does not permit me to pursue the many questions raised by this approach to fiction. Suffice it to say that Sukla obviously conceives of fictions very broadly, as something like the products of humans' creative and imaginative approaches to the world. That conception is behind his edited volume, which, he says, focuses

on fiction as a significant phenomenon in human consciousness, carries fiction beyond its mainstream confinement (i.e. literary or even linguistic in general) and projects its nature and function in many of our cultural exercises such as metaphysics, mathematics, religion, history, semantics and law -- projecting simultaneously how not only verbal art, but also all other forms of art such as pictorial, gestural, sonic and audio-visual, are also fictions of various modes (p. 3).

A collection of articles about fiction might have concentrated on some more special problem that lets itself be understood as a problem concerning fiction. Since fiction can be a literary genre or macro-genre, one can ask questions about the definition of that genre, its history, its mode of operation, its value, and so forth. There is also the concept of fictionality, a concept which gives rise to a number of possible questions. What is to be understood by fictionality, and why? How are fictions employed in the sciences and the arts? What is the ontological status of fictions, for example, of fictional characters in literature? And so on. One might have homed in on some such problem, or on a group of problems. Or one might have attempted to produce a kind of organized overview of the problems and their interrelations. Sukla wants to understand fiction as being something much broader. He might then have attempted to produce a collection devised to shed light on humans' creative imagination in their encounters with the world. What he seems in fact to have done is to invite scholars from a number of disciplines to write essays related to fiction, "fiction" taken in a wide but rather indefinite sense, while leaving the contributors much freedom in their understanding of their roles.

Fiction and Art is divided into four parts. Part I, "Historical Perspectives", consists of two essays about fictional texts and myths in the Greco-Roman world (David Konstan; Claude Calame). The eleven articles in Part II, "Interdisciplinary Perspectives", bring up subjects concerning metaphysics (Peter Heron), mathematics (Jody Azzouni), religion (Ivan Strenski), history (Allen Speight), literary aesthetics (Robert Stecker; Jukka Mikkonen), literary fiction as facilitating philosophical thought experiments (Aleks Zarnitsyn), fictional characters and the logic of proper names (Carl Ehrett), narrative nonfiction (Sarah Worth), the nature of literary fiction (Amanda Garcia), and fiction as an aid to overcoming certain limitations of our consciousness (Samuel Kimball).

Part III, "Aesthetic Perspectives", contains nine contributions. There are essays on topics from literature (Kimball again), visual art (Charles Altieri), music (Geraldine Finn), dance (Renee Conroy), theatre (Roderick Nicholls), and film and photography (David Fenner). In addition, this group of essays features an article on the French seventeenth-century factum genre (Christian Biet, a reprinted item), and also two essays of a more general nature: about fictional worlds (Lubomír Doležel) and about the rendering of subjectivity in fictional kinds of art (Rob van Gerwen). Part IV, finally, "Oriental Perspectives", comprises four articles on subjects from Indian literature (Sukla), Chinese literature (Amy Lee), Japanese literature (Robert Steen), and Arabic literature (Arkady Nedel).

This may sound a bit like the organized overview of problems and their interrelations that I mentioned as a possible plan for a collection of this kind, and it is true that not a few of the topics or questions that I referred to come up in various places. But the choice of subjects for the articles seems rather unsupervised, and the approaches of the writers are highly dissimilar, so not much synergy is created, at least not for me. On the other hand, I get the feeling that many of the contributors produced texts that they were very pleased to get an occasion to write, and there are many readable and inventive pieces in Sukla's collection. I would like to mention some of those, well aware that I will have to be brief and selective and also subjective -- readers with different interests and convictions may well find other essays more fascinating.

I read Azzouni's "Mathematical Fictions" with enthusiasm. Azzouni denies the existence of mathematical objects and assures us that "no mathematical terms refer" (p. 69). Part of his argument centers on the illusion of aboutness created by statements, particularly by statements that are obviously true. Azzouni's criticism of what he calls "aboutness illusions" (p. 67) does not strike me as new -- Nelson Goodman explained in Languages of Art (1968) how pictures of Pickwick are not really of anybody but are rather a special kind of pictures: Pickwick-pictures. But Azzouni uses his criticism of aboutness illusions to dismantle the very common and very strategic but certainly -- I agree with him -- mistaken idea that a statement that is true or false has to be about something which exists. He goes on to explain why geometry is useful despite its lack of reference and from there to the conventionality of logic (a point at which I begin to feel the need to ask some questions about the limits of conventionality in logic). I find Azzouni's article very substantial and his direct and spirited style irresistible. But I know that ontology is not my field of expertise, nor is mathematics.

Altieri ("Pictorial Fiction: Imagination and Power of Picasso's Images") uses a "resurrected", non-Romantic concept of imagination as a means of better understanding Picasso and his development from Girl with a Mandolin (1909) to Three Musicians (1921). Tthe gist of Altieri's argument is:

I claim that Picasso realizes not nature but the raw powers of imagination available by looking at his own labours to decouple visual imagination from fantasies of accurate representation or even Cézannian realization. For Picasso form becomes a mode of self-consciousness that captures the effect of one's powers to transfigure nature and make a basic creative force emerge in all its potency. One reason for accepting this emphasis is that then we can produce a rather simple story affording continuity between Picasso's Cubist and Surrealist orientations, something very difficult to do if you see the painter's struggles as primarily with the demands of visual cognition (pp. 261-262).

That sounds very plausible to me -- I am not a specialist on Picasso -- but what I found really impressive in Altieri's article was the resurrected idea of indomitable imagination. Altieri refers to Edward Casey's Imagining: A Phenomenological Study (1976, 2000) but also brings the idea to life through fine quotations from Picasso and through passages like the one I cited.

There were other essays that I read with special interest. Strenski's "Why Suicide Bombers Bomb: Fictionality of Rituals" was one; it is an attempt to explain how Palestinian suicide bombers can view their acts as religious sacrifices that also bestow holiness on Palestine. Stecker's "Cognitive Value of (Literary) Fiction" offers a reasoned assessment of the cognitive value of literary fiction written with reference to views put forward by Gregory Currie; I find the essay balanced (and for once I feel competent to judge) and pleasurable to read. Conroy's "Gestural Fiction: Dance" is a critical but generous discussion of Susan Langer's theory of dance as virtual spontaneous gesture in her Feeling and Form (1953). Conroy also introduced -- at least for me -- rewarding things to say about the multiplicity of dance performances and about the "complex imagined landscape" (p. 299) such a performance can create. I apologize again for my brevity, selectivity, and subjectivity, but I did want to emphasize that readers are likely to find articles in this collection that will stimulate and perhaps even stun them; at least, that happened to me.

The five essays that I just mentioned also illustrate the diversity of the collection: they are about the nonexistence of mathematical objects, the role of transfiguring imagination in Picasso's work, the ideology of Palestinian suicide bombers, the cognitive value of literary fiction, and Langer's theory of dance. The words "fiction" or "fictionality" are found in the title or subtitle of all five. Indeed, the words "fiction" or "fictional" or "fictionality" are found in the title or subtitle of all the essays in the collection. To me, those titles often feel as if they were imposed from the outside and had little to do with the real content of the articles. Yet, of course, if one understands the concept of fiction in Sukla's broad way, all 26 contributions in this collection are certainly essays about fiction.