Fiction and Narrative

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Derek Matravers, Fiction and Narrative, Oxford University Press, 2014, 169pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199647019.

Reviewed by Jukka Mikkonen, University of Tampere


Derek Matravers engages in a "phenomenological project" and explores what goes on in the mind of the reader of a work of fiction. Matravers aims to show that the prevailing "consensus view" of fiction is misguided and there is no special link between fiction and imagination. He argues that the fundamental distinction to be made in the philosophy of fiction is not that between fiction and non-fiction, in which the former are (intended to be) imagined and the latter (intended to be) believed, but between "representations" and "confrontations," where the distinctive criterion is action.

The ten chapters discuss fiction, imagination, belief, and narrative. Matravers begins his inquiry by examining Kendall Walton's influential theory of fiction as presented in Walton's Mimesis as Make-Believe (1990). From Walton's work he formulates the "transformative criterion," which maintains that "something is a fiction if the imagination is required to transform a proposition true in the actual world into a different proposition true in the fictional world" (p. 13). Matravers then argues that the transformative criterion does not distinguish actual propositions from fictional propositions, as sentences in a novel are not (often) transformed into anything -- and that Walton's real and hypothetical defenses of the criterion cannot save it. Further, he claims that nothing is gained by imagining a proposition to be true or making-believe it, and that grasping the content or sense of sentences in a novel is enough for one to understand it. In turn, Matravers argues that not only fictional representations mandate imaginings: "If a passage from Madame Bovary can mandate that I imagine seeing Emma, a passage from my biography of Churchill can mandate that I imagine seeing the House of Commons provoke Chamberlain's resignation" (pp. 16-17). After scrutinizing Walton's view, Matravers explores Gregory Currie's simulation theory of fiction. He asserts that the simulation theory is also unsound, as "non-standard inputs and an absence of motivation as an output" characterize not only fiction, but also our engagement with representations in general (p. 27). Also, he remarks that simulating a situation does not necessarily block outputs: one's understanding of a situation, achieved via simulation, may lead to action, such as one's avoiding certain sorts of situations.

Matravers wants to shift the focus from the distinction between fiction and non-fiction to a distinction between "representations" and "confrontations," that is, situations in which action is not possible (because what is being represented to us is out of reach) and situations in which action is possible. In "confrontation relations," our "mental states are caused by perceptual inputs from the objects of those states, and which cause actions towards objects in our egocentric space" (p. 50). In "representation relations," in turn, our "mental states are not caused by perceptions of the objects of those states, and do not result in actions towards objects in our egocentric space (although, of course, they can still cause actions)" (p. 50). Matravers maintains that in a confrontation relation the possibility of action is built into it, and the objects are in one's "immediate environment" (p. 113). Furthermore, confrontations do not require the imagination, for one does not need to imagine being confronted by a wolf when there is a wolf before one's eyes. Representations, in turn, come in various kinds and on a continuum from "thin" to "thick." Representations may have different functions, such as education, persuasion, or entertainment, and a single representation may be used for several purposes. Thin representations, such as those used in conveying information, do not require imagination but are comprehended using "the usual mechanisms of processing beliefs" (p. 57). In turn, thick representations, such as fictional narratives, invite imaginative engagement.

If theories of fiction and fiction-making encourage one to invent counter-examples and deviations from the norm, so does the distinction between confrontations and representations. What subtle conversational threat -- one that contains references to assault and mutilation -- would appeal to the imagination and emotions (assuming that one would be able and willing to imagine its content)? Does not a representation such as a WWF or Oxfam television advertisement have a "possibility of action" built into it, if it urges one to donate money by calling a certain number? On the other hand, Matravers's theory opens up interesting perspectives to interactive representations and virtual confrontations. For example, the notions of immediate environment and artificial devices that can be used to extend one's "epistemological reach" and one's obligations to act (p. 49) could prove useful in analyzing virtual war, in which drone operators, who kill actual people virtually, might be more aware of the battlefield (especially the aftermath of their mission) and thus perhaps more involved in the situation than fighter pilots.

Anyway, Matravers thinks that fictional and non-fictional representations are understood basically the same way, for they both are to a large extent narratives. In order to show that readers process fictional and non-fictional narratives the same way, Matravers turns to psychological studies on text comprehension (Richard Gerrig, Philip Johnson-Laird, Marisa Bortolussi and Peter Dixon, Gail McKoon and Roger Ratcliff and others). However, Matravers acknowledges that psychological studies on reading do not generally distinguish between "thick" and "thin" representations, or "story" and "discourse", or skilled and unskilled readers. Also, he cites the cognitive psychologist Gordon Bower, who maintains that the schema theory proves suitable for explaining a reader's interpretation of (fictional) texts that depict stereotypical situations (p. 62). Now, if psychological studies tend to "focus on the simplest case: reading merely for understanding of a realistic narrative" (p. 64), one might wonder how illuminating they are in explaining our encounters with literary fiction, especially works that go beyond the stereotypical situations and the ordinary?

For Matravers, engaging with a presentation is basically about understanding it: reading King Lear and comprehending its words and sentences, for example. However, thick representations, fictional or non-fictional, call for exercising the imagination as a result of engaging with the representation, for example, visually imagining the content of a work (or a passage thereof). Matravers argues that our engaging with a representation (narrative) is neutral between non-fiction and fiction, and that imagination does not separate fiction from non-fiction. As he sees it,

The experience of reading de Quincey's 'The Revolt of the Tartars' is the same whether we believe it is non-fictional, believe it is fictional, or (as is most likely) we are ignorant of whether it is non-fictional or fictional (in fact, it is a highly fictionalized account of actual events). (p. 78)

Matravers's view is absorbing and captures what many philosophers, including myself, have been dissatisfied with in the consensus view: namely, that the relation between imagination and belief in our encounters with fictional and non-fictional narratives seems much more complicated than that presented in definitions of the "fictive stance." Although Matravers discusses imagination from various perspectives, he does not pursue the (assumedly) different kinds of imagining involved in reading fiction and non-fiction. Is there not a difference in the "direction" of imagination, or the "internal" and "external" perspectives on the content of a work, in reading fiction and non-fiction? For example, in reading a work of fictional literature, we often speculate about the fictional world of the work -- or truth in fiction -- whereas "external considerations," our thinking of the content of the work in terms of reality, might or might not take place. In turn, when engaging with Searle's "Chinese Room" we might not put much effort into pondering why the man was locked in the room (a perfect literary concern), as we think through the philosophical implications of the thought-experiment. And what about our engaging with the assumed authorial assertions in fiction? Is it certain that we assess their truth-value (which is what Matravers claims and which might be the case), or do we rather consider their truth-conditions?

Moreover, I think that it is problematic to assimilate fiction and non-fiction under the broad category of "narrative," since literary fictions are more than narratives, on the one hand, and literary narratives and real-life narratives differ in their nature, on the other hand. One might argue that we have different expectations when approaching fiction and non-fiction, such as the look for closure; this would be, I suppose, a central interest in the phenomenology of reading. Also, we clearly allow more indeterminacy for literary narratives (not always asking, e.g., who is speaking? when does the depicted event take place?) than journalistic pieces, which implies that there are different functions for artistic and non-artistic narratives, namely aesthetic enjoyment and communication, respectively.

In the latter part of the book, Matravers applies his view of representations to key problems in contemporary theory of fiction. He attempts to show that questions related to fictional narrators, the so-called "paradox of fiction" and the problem of "imaginative resistance," are not problems with fiction but with narratives. As for "imaginative resistance," for example, Matravers argues that the fundamental distinction is not between possible and impossible narratives but between "narratives that obey the reality principle and narratives that do not, and then, within the latter group, narratives where one or more of the strategies [of reading] work and narratives in which they do not." (p. 134) In places, Matravers's arguments end abruptly, as when admitting that he does not have a solution for a problem (e.g., our unwillingness to imagine deviant moral views). Nevertheless, he is highly successful in pointing at problems and weaknesses in earlier solution attempts, and he also suggests interesting new directions from which to approach the problems. In the last chapter, Matravers attempts to illustrate that much of what he has said about the written word also applies to our interaction with film, where imagination cannot mark the distinction between non-fiction film and fiction film either.

Fiction and Narrative is a concise work that consists of short chapters tightly packed with arguments; yet, it manages to do a lot. In addition to providing an intriguing theoretical reorientation, the book has substantial value in clarifying (and questioning) recent debates around fiction.