Fictional Objects

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Stuart Brock and Anthony Everett (eds.), Fictional Objects, Oxford University Press, 2015, 299 pp., $75 (hbk), ISBN978-0-19-873559-5.

Reviewed by Takashi Yagisawa, California State University, Northridge


Fictional stories speak of a number of objects. Some of those objects are taken from outside fiction (e.g., London in the Sherlock Holmes stories, Napoleon in War and Peace), but others are not (e.g., Sherlock Holmes, Pierre Bezukhov). The latter, objects indigenous to the stories, are fictional objects. Metaphysics of fictional objects is the theme of this collection of eleven original papers. All of the papers are elaborations on and/or extensions of the respective authors' earlier works, except for the last paper (by Anthony Everett and Timothy Schroeder).

Commonsensical platitudes about fictional objects are abundant and apparently jointly inconsistent if taken literally. A well-known example is the pair, "Sherlock Holmes was created by Arthur Conan Doyle" and "Sherlock Holmes never existed." Being created appears to entail being brought into existence, so the first of the pair appears to entail what the second negates. One response to this is to deny the apparent entailment. Another is to embrace Holmes as existent. Either response gives rise to further issues: e.g., "What does 'create' mean if not 'bring into existence'?"; "How do we explain the truth of literary critics' assertions about Holmes without accepting Holmes as existent?"; "What makes Holmes fictional if existent?" Some theorists let their nominalistic penchant constrain acceptable theorizing about Holmes, while others show few qualms about including abstract objects in their ontology. Some theorists find it helpful to speak of nonactual possible (or impossible) worlds in discussing Holmes, while others steadfastly keep their discourse actualist. Exhibiting varying theoretical threads with recurring leitmotifs, the papers collected in this volume convey the complexity, intricacy, and depth of the current state of the metaphysics of fictional objects.

I shall discuss the papers by William G. Lycan, Amie L. Thomasson, and Everett and Schroeder. I shall then provide synopses of the other papers with occasional brief comments.

Lycan defends the view that Holmes exists in nonactual (fictional) worlds. One objection is that since different men at different worlds fit Doyle's descriptions of Holmes but the name "Sherlock Holmes" is supposed to name a unique man, the name does not name any of these men. Lycan's reply is that we can "simply stipulate that [we are] about to describe a world containing Sherlock Holmes" (31). Lycan has a metalinguistic thesis to go with this: "a fictional person qualifies as being (=) [Holmes] if and only if the relevant use of that person's name is connected in the right historical way with Conan Doyle's original act of writing (in the real world)" (27).

When describing a nonactual world, if we use the name with the right historical connection to Doyle's original use, are we thereby making the stipulation or are we merely in a position to make the stipulation? It is unclear, but it does not matter; for all the work is done by the right historical connection. If the stipulation piggybacks on the presence of the right historical connection, it comes for free. If the stipulation is an additional act, it is otiose.

Given that Lycan espouses haecceitism for fictional objects, his stipulation reply is odd. If Holmes has his own haecceity, then for any nonactual x, x is Holmes if and only if x has Holmes' haecceity. Why is this not sufficient as a reply? Remember that Kripke's own famous stipulation view concerning transworld identity is about actual objects (e.g., Richard M. Nixon): any man at any nonactual world we actually speak of is Nixon if and only if we actually stipulate him to be Nixon. Which actual man at the actual world is Nixon is not up to us to stipulate. Nor is it a matter of fitting purely qualitative descriptions. Fictional objects are different. We can identify Nixon's haecceity in a historical way, if he has one. But even if Holmes has his own haecceity, we cannot identify it in a historical way. We can at best so identify Doyle's original act of using the name "Sherlock Holmes." Doyle's act actually took place and Holmes does not actually exist; there is no historical connection between them.

Thomasson defends artifactualism, according to which we bring into actual existence fictional objects by means of acts of make-believe. She likens fictional objects to humanly created social and cultural artifacts like contracts, laws, and stories. Thomasson's defense consists of the observation that the linguistic rules of use for the expressions "fictional character" and "exist" make it a trivial conceptual truth that an author's (actual) pretending use of the name "N" in writing fiction is sufficient for the (actual) existence of a fictional character N. Holmes came into existence when Doyle wrote his stories in a way strictly parallel to the way in which a marriage comes into existence when appropriate vows and paperwork are sincerely undertaken by qualified individuals. Thomasson emphasizes how easy it is to bring a fictional character into actual existence: an author's story-telling act will do it. She calls this the "deflationary realist" position.

At first this sounds perfectly reasonable. The rules of the language game concerning fiction guarantee that given what Doyle did, we are entitled to assert the sentences, "Holmes came into existence" and "Holmes exists." When two people get married, a marriage comes into existence. As they remain married, the marriage continues to exist. All there is to the talk of the marriage coming into existence is that the two people acted in a certain way. The people and whatever sundry items required for their acting that way are all we need in our ontology to be in a position to assert, "A marriage exists." The existence of a marriage is deflated in comparison to the existence of the people and the sundry items.

But this is not what Thomasson has in mind at all. She is explicit about it: "But it is important to note that it is deflationary only in the meta-ontological sense (of thinking the debates may be settled easily), not in holding that the entities in question exist in some second-class or deflated way. On the contrary, . . . , the deflationary realist should maintain that there are the relevant entities in the only sense the terms in question have -- and so be a simple realist about the entities in question" (260). Her opponents might say that Thomasson is trying to have her cake and eat it too; if (given the relevant acts) the linguistic rules trivially entail the existence claims about marriages and fictional characters, then such claims are not to be taken with ontological seriousness. Thomasson has a response in the form of a challenge: "articulate what more it would take for the serious existence claim to be true" (269). Her opponents might regard the "serious existence" claims on marriages and fictional characters unintelligible in a way analogous (but not identical) to the way in which an ontological pluralist might regard the ascription of the same kind of existence to the shadow of a pole as to the pole unintelligible. As entities, shadows are such that their existence is "second-rate"; as entities, marriages and fictional characters are such that their existence is not "serious."

Speaking of the entailment of the "serious existence" claims by the linguistic rules (given the relevant acts), Thomasson emphasizes how really very trivial it is. But if she is right, how is it possible that her opponents do not see it? This should not be regarded as a variant of the paradox of analysis. Russell's analysis of descriptions, for example, is not trivial in Thomasson's sense. The more Thomasson insists how trivial the entailment is, the more incredible her claim becomes to her opponents.

Everett and Schroeder offer an actualist ontology of fictional characters that is friendlier to the nominalist sentiment than artifactualism. They propose that we identify fictional characters with what they call fictional-person ideas. Ideas are content-bearing mental states (as opposed to the contents of content-bearing mental states), and fictional-person ideas are "ideas for telling a story as if there were a particular person with certain features" (279). Like fictional characters, fictional-person ideas are created by people at particular times, and inspired by real objects or events or other fictional-person ideas. Holmes is "said to be rather one-dimensional, to be modestly original, to be inspired by Dr. Joseph Bell for whom Conan Doyle once worked, and so on" (279). The corresponding fictional-person idea Doyle had is also rather one-dimensional, modestly original, inspired by Dr. Bell, and so on. So we should identity Holmes with this fictional-person idea.

One might wonder whether mental states (as opposed to their contents) can really be one-dimensional or modestly original. But Everett and Schroeder allow ideas to be (mis-)individuated by content in ordinary discourse. They also allow different people to have the same idea, so that ideas may match the temporal duration and non-private nature of fictional characters.

Everett and Schroeder think that they can accommodate the platitude that Holmes does not (actually) exist, by pointing out that even though Holmes is a fictional-person idea, which exists, the fictional-person idea represents a particular person who is called "Holmes" and who does not exist. But this is unlikely to satisfy those who support the platitude, for it accuses the platitude of engaging in doubletalk; "Holmes" is used to name the fictional character under one breath, and the person it represents under another, and Everett and Schroeder admit as much. Still, their proposal opens up a path worth pursuing for those who are inclined to regard fictional characters as actually existing.

Robert Howell argues for a view similar to Lycan's. Like Lycan, Howell emphasizes that fiction readers' use of the name of a fictional character is anchored in the author's use of the name in writing the fiction. Like Lycan, Howell speaks of nonfactual worlds of fiction. When using "Holmes" as a name inherited from Doyle, we assume that it rigidly refers to a unique individual who was a detective, lived in London, etc. Since there actually was no such individual, we assume that the name rigidly refers to a unique individual at a nonactual world. And that world "enters the discussion through the readers' nonconscious assumption (expressed in their thoughts) that there is indeed a world at which" (45) their use of "Holmes" refers to a unique individual who was and behaved as the stories say. On Howell's view, sharing such an assumption enables different readers to talk about the same fictional detective. But it is unclear how that works, for it is unclear how different readers manage to share the same world of fiction.

David Braun sketches his "gappy proposition" view and applies it to our discourse on fictional objects and properties ("attributes" in his terminology) and mythical objects and properties. He accepts the actual existence of fictional objects and properties and mythical objects and properties, but disagrees with those who share the same ontology about what to say in particular cases. He discusses Le Verrier's Vulcan extensively. Le Verrier intended that as he used it, the name "Vulcan" refer to nothing if his theory were radically wrong. For this reason, according to Braun, "Vulcan" referred to nothing as he used it and Le Verrier asserted or believed no propositions about the mythical planet but asserted and believed gappy propositions of the form ". . . ( ) . . . ," where the gap points to the position occupied by the name "Vulcan" in the corresponding sentences. Braun resists positing use-ambiguity of "Vulcan" à la Kripke. Instead, he posits a single use that is indeterminate in its reference; indeterminate between referring to nothing and referring to the mythical planet. Simple empty proper names and simple empty general terms in the mouths of their introducers (who intend them to be nonempty) have no semantic content, thereby giving rise to gappy propositions. Even if there are mythical objects and properties, such expressions do not have these objects or properties as their semantic values in the languages of the introducers.

Nathan Salmon sketches his theory of mythical objects. Vulcan was believed by Le Verrier to affect Mercury's orbit, but there has never actually been an intra-Mercurial planet. We cannot make sense of this, according to Salmon, without attributing actual existence to Vulcan, which is not a planet but Le Verrier believed it to be a planet. Peter Geach's well-known and much discussed Hob/Nob example is handled by means of a similar account. There is an x that is either a real witch or a real object that is a mythical witch such that Hob believes x . . . and Nob wonders whether x . . . Salmon maintains that the word "witch" is ambiguously used between "real witch" and "mythical witch" in Geach's sentence. This is intended to support "the tenacious intuition that the social anthropologist who sincerely utters (Geach's sentence) does not thereby inadvertently undertake a commitment to witches" (124).

Alberto Voltolini combines artifactualism with neo-Meinongianism, according to which fictional objects are correlates of property sets, and maintains that acts of make-believe enable us to correlate fictional objects to property sets. Voltolini claims that this combination of views enables us to satisfy seven desiderata concerning fictional objects: (1) nonexistence, (2) causal inefficacy, (3) incompleteness, (4) created character, (5) actual possession of the narrated properties, (6) unrevisability of the ascription of the narrated properties, and (7) necessary possession of the narrated properties. While discussing (6), Voltolini says, "Again, Sherlock Holmes is a detective. Why so? Because Doyle decided to tell the story about him thusly. Had he decided to tell the story differently, Holmes would have had different features" (135). Given that Doyle could have decided to tell the story differently, this seems to entail that (7) is violated.

Frederick Kroon argues that Peter van Inwagen's well-known semantic argument for creationism (artifactualism) is subject to reductio ad absurdum when we consider indiscernible fictional objects. Kroon develops two creationist responses and counters them. The second creationist response says, concerning Tolkien's fiction, that even if there are no indiscernible fictional dwarves, there is a collection of fictional dwarves. Kroon's reply is that the semantic argument yields the conclusion that the number of the indiscernible fictional dwarves is indeterminate, which defies the reality of such a collection. Creationists might respond to this by rejecting Everett's principle (P2): "If a fictional story concerns a and b, and if a and b are not real things, then a and b are identical in the world of the story iff the fictional character of a is identical to the fictional character of b" (165). Alternatively, creationists might bite the bullet and insist that there is nothing wrong with the reality of a collection of an indeterminate number of indiscernible created abstract objects.

Ben Caplan and Cathleen Muller defend the thesis that if there are any fictional characters, then there is no true, finitely stateable, informative way to give necessary and sufficient conditions for the identity of fictional characters. They do so by arguing that two theories of identity concerning fictional characters meant to give such a way -- Terence Parsons' theory and Benjamin Schnieder and Tatjana von Solodkoff's theory -- fail to do so. Caplan and Muller argue that these two theories give rise to arbitrariness. In a short story they tell under the title "A Curious New Shop" it is arbitrary how many fictional characters there are. They follow up on this example to generate an even shorter story, "A Problematic Story," to show that Parsons' theory succumbs to the same kind of arbitrariness (object-number arbitrariness). Schnieder and von Solodkoff's theory is argued to be subject to a different kind of arbitrariness (principle-truth arbitrariness), for there is no non-arbitrary way to choose between their theory and its competitor.

Sarah Sawyer argues that reference to a fictional character by a fictional name presupposes reference to a fictional property by a fictional predicate, by examining representative theories of fictional names: Gregory Currie's tripartite theory, Fred Adams, Gary Fuller, and Robert Stecker's truth-value-gap theory, Braun's gappy proposition theory, Parsons' neo-Meinongian theory, Edward N. Zalta's Mally-ist theory, and Thomasson's artifactualism. Sawyer defends a form of pretense theory, and the crux of her defense is the claim that the pretended-truth of fictional sentences entails the supposed truth of metafictional sentences.

Stuart Brock defends the view that realism about fictional characters is false, i.e., that fictional characters do not (actually) exist, by extending his previously mounted fictionalist defense of the view. He argues that adding fictional characters to our ontology has no explanatory value, hence it is not justified. On page 245 we see an example:

Every novel written by J.K. Rowling is about a number of fictional characters.
The novel in my office was written by J.K. Rowling.
Therefore, the novel in my office is about a number of fictional characters.

Validity of this argument would support realism, but on Brock's fictionalist view, the first premise and the conclusion are prefixed with an "according to theory" operator, but the second premise is not:

According to the realist's theory of fictional characters, every novel written by J.K. Rowling is about a number of fictional characters.
The novel in my office was written by J.K. Rowling.
Therefore, according to the realist's theory of fictional characters, the novel in my office is about a number of fictional characters.

With the operator added explicitly, the argument is invalid, and Brock defends this verdict from objections.


Thanks to David Liebesman for helpful comments on an earlier draft.