Fictionalism in Metaphysics

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Mark Eli Kalderon (ed.), Fictionalism in Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2005, 368pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199282196.

Reviewed by Cei Maslen, Victoria University of Wellington, New Zealand


The simple idea behind fictionalist views is that telling or describing a story does not commit you to the existence of characters in the story. Saying "according to the Peter Rabbit story, there is a talking rabbit" does not commit you to the existence of a talking rabbit. Then fictionalism about Fs is the view that the theory of Fs is merely a fiction; on one version of fictionalism, talk about Fs should be interpreted as tacitly prefixed by "according to story S", where S is an appropriate story. For example, fictionalism about possible worlds ("modal fictionalism"), as introduced by Rosen in 1990, interprets talk of possible worlds as tacitly prefixed by "according to Lewis's story from On the Plurality of Worlds". Rosen's view then reaps all the benefits of Lewis's elaborate production without needing to adopt Lewis's florid ontology. With ontological parsimony at a premium, the appeal to metaphysicians of this easy strategy is obvious; these days, it seems that a good metaphysician should be a fictionalist about everything she can lay her hands on (or rather not lay her hands on, I should say).

Of course, matters are not so easy. Fictionalism about any area must be carefully argued for, and there are many technical difficulties to solve. Kalderon's collection of eleven papers, written by top philosophers in the field, represents the breadth and width of the topic. As well as reflecting the variety of areas amenable to plausible fictionalist treatment (possible worlds, mathematical entities, unobservable scientific entities, truth, morality, fictional characters, composite objects) it also introduces a wide variety of degrees and species of fictionalism, and tackles some of the tricky technical problems that seem to have cursed fictionalism from its beginnings. (The taxonomies can be bewildering -- note the careful historical research required to classify any one figure as a fictionalist rather than an anti-realist of a subtly different brand. See Rosen (chapter 1).) The papers are all of extremely high quality, and contain important original work. (All but Walton's piece (chapter 2) have not been previously published.)

Kalderon's definition of fictionalism is somewhat broader than the idea presented above. A fictionalist view about Fs is the view that although sentences about Fs do express propositions, acceptance of a sentence about Fs does not involve belief that the proposition expressed is true. Instead, acceptance may either involve having a different attitude than belief to the proposition expressed, or it may involve belief that some other proposition is true. The latter case may be called cognitivist fictionalism and the former case noncognitivist fictionalism. Examples of noncognitivist fictionalisms are the view that accepting "there are Fs" involves pretending that there are Fs, or that accepting "there are Fs" involves believing that the proposition that there are Fs is empirically adequate. One example of cognitivist fictionalism is the view that accepting "there are Fs" involves the belief that according to some fiction there are Fs. Another example of cognitivist fictionalism is a "world-oriented" view: accepting that "there are Fs" involves the belief in a proposition about the real world -- not the belief that there are Fs in the real world but some other belief. This relies on Walton's distinction between content-oriented make-believe and world-oriented make-believe. (See Walton, chapter 2, and Yablo, chapter 3. Note that Walton uses the term "prop-oriented make-believe" instead of "world-oriented make-believe".) In a game of make-believe, one might use the game in order to focus on the imaginary situation itself, or use the game in order to focus on the real world. The latter is world-oriented make-believe and the former content-oriented make-believe. Suppose that a child psychologist helps victims of the Tsunami express their traumatic experiences by playing with puppets. A child says "all the other animals ran away and the little bird lost its mother" in order to express the real world truth that during the Tsunami the people in her village ran away and she couldn't find her mother. This is world-oriented make-believe, because the ultimate purpose is to express events in the real world. Accepting the sentence "the little bird lost its mother" involves believing a proposition about the world -- that the speaker lost her mother. Yablo describes a world-oriented fictionalism about applied mathematics and pure mathematics (chapter 3).

Another important distinction is between hermeneutic (descriptive) and revolutionary (prescriptive) fictionalism. Hermeneutic fictionalism is the view that current usage of sentences about Fs is what is given by the fictionalist analysis; revolutionary fictionalism is the view that usage of sentences about Fs ought to be what is given by the fictionalist analysis. (How deep can a proposal be about how we ought to change our usage of certain words, you might ask? There's glory for you.) Revolutionary fictionalists can consistently combine their prescriptive claim with the usual gamut of descriptive views on the current usage of claims about Fs. For example, they could judge all current positive claims about Fs to be false, remain agnostic about their truth values, or hold some kind of expressivism about claims about Fs. Or things could be as Lewis suggests: the revolutionary fictionalist "might describe us -- some or all of us -- as being in a state of confusion such that fictionalism … would be the minimal unconfused revision of our present state" (see chapter 10). It's presumably not even out of the question that a revolutionary fictionalist hold a fictionalist view about the current usage of sentences about Fs and argue that we ought to hold a different fictionalist view about the usage of sentences about Fs.

Rosen (chapter 1) looks at three cases -- Pyrrhonian skepticism, ancient and renaissance astronomy and Bentham's theory of fictions -- in order to trace some precursors of modern fictionalism and distinguish fictionalism from "less exciting thoughts". His paper develops the modern fictionalist taxonomy in the attempt to classify these sophisticated historical views. It turns out that one important thing to watch out for is to distinguish fictionalists from pessimistic or frustrated realists. As Rosen says, "Everyone agrees that a false claim can be acceptable for certain purposes. The fictionalist's distinctive claim is that a false claim can be ideally acceptable".

Seahwa Kim's piece (chapter 4) is a very careful reply to one objection to modal fictionalism. Even those who are willing to countenance fictions as abstract entities may believe fictions to be contingent and temporally restricted entities. (They are contingent if the author might not have written them, and temporally restricted if they did not exist before they were first created). It may then be puzzling how modal fictionalism can successfully analyze some necessary and eternal truths in terms of contingent and temporally restricted entities. So you might worry that before Lewis's On the Plurality of Worlds was written in 1986, no modal claims were true, and that if he had never written that book no modal claims would have been true. Kim is careful to fully develop this objection and argues that modal fictionalism needs modifying in order to respond to this objection in the most satisfying way.

From here on in I focus primarily on the contributions on moral fictionalism (Joyce, contribution 9, Lewis, contribution 10, and Blackburn, contribution 11). My apologies for failing to discuss the other excellent papers.

Joyce (chapter 9) gives an extended and careful argument for a noncognitivist revolutionary fictionalism about morality. He argues that if we accept an error theory about morality, then we still have some (prudential) reasons to be fictionalists about morality. He presents some empirical analysis of the societal and psychological payoffs of pretending to believe in the claims of morality. And he concludes that pretending that morality is after all true may help us to achieve these payoffs. The idea is that if the passing thought of your ruined reputation won't stop you from acting unwisely, then the pretence that you are morally bad together with the strong feeling of guilt that comes along with it may be enough to stop you. Just as exciting visual images may be more effective in selling a product than hard facts, an exciting pretence may be the best way to go.

This is a curious though careful and persuasive argument. Of course there may be other, more effective, tactics for improving self-control. One expects that a fire-and-brimstone theistic view could make for quite vigorous pretenses and even stronger feelings of guilt. Or perhaps there exist gentler forms of self-deception to the same effect, relying on rewards and positive feelings instead of guilt. Joyce does suggest that morality may be a particularly effective pretence because we (most of us) are brought up to believe it to be true, but one does wonder what is coming next.

Lewis (chapter 10) argues that Blackburn's quasi-realism is a fictionalist view -- a revolutionary fictionalist view. I don't think that Blackburn really responds to Lewis's main point here, which I take to be the significance of Blackburn's projectivist preface. ("I think the fictionalist's disowning preface to all that comes after has in fact been provided in Blackburn's motivating discussion [of projectivism]", as Lewis says.) I am reluctant to enter into this debate about quasi-realism. But let me say a few words about Blackburn's "well-founded mistrust" of fictionalism, at least moral fictionalism, which he voices while arguing that his quasi-realism is not a version of fictionalism, (chapter 11). (Personally, I found Blackburn's criticisms in this chapter refreshing after hearing exclusively from those sympathetic to fictionalism in the rest of the collection and, to a lesser degree, in the recent literature, and also because he was airing common suspicions about fictionalist views.)

It is impossible to criticize all versions of fictionalism in one breath, but a widespread dislike of fictionalist views seems to rest on the complaint that they are advocating duplicity or hypocrisy. This seems to be part of what is behind Blackburn's mistrust; as he says, "Fie upon such hypocrisy". I'm not sure whether the charge is that this is unhealthy, despicable or simply preposterous. (If the charge is that it is immoral, then of course a smart-alecky fictionalist will just pretend to agree while not believing himself to be in the wrong.) In any case, Joyce gives some reasons why fictionalists should not be seen in this way. For one thing (as explained below) when a non-fictionalist challenges a fictionalist to justify his moral views, this may establish a critical context in which the non-fictionalist will willingly retract his positive moral claims. For another thing, it is no part of fictionalism to have the intention to deceive others or oneself. Finally, there will be no need for deception within a group of people who are all fictionalists.

I'd like to end with some comparison of cognitivist and noncognitivist views of revolutionary moral fictionalism. Can each be taken equally far? Suppose, for the sake of argument, that Joyce is right that there are good reasons for accepting revolutionary moral fictionalism. Is he also right that a noncognitivist version is preferable to a cognitivist version? Joyce states two reasons to prefer the noncognitivist version to a "tacit story operator" cognitivist view. The first reason involves his notion of a critical context. (The second reason is a more serious worry about "logically complex contexts" that I will not outline here.) A critical context is a context in which the fictionalist is "at his most undistracted, reflective, and critical" -- the philosophy classroom, or another situation where he is challenged (by himself or another person) to justify his beliefs. While in ordinary situations, Joyce instructs his moral fictionalist to pretend that moral claims are true, in critical contexts he is supposed to drop the pretence and express his true belief that all positive moral claims are false. Joyce criticizes the tacit story operator view as being unable to allow for such contexts.

Does Joyce really need to allow a critical context in which the fictionalist drops the pretence? I can think of three functions that the critical context serves for Joyce. Joyce first introduces the critical context in order to explain why it is correct to attribute the belief that P is false to the fictionalist, even though, while he is pretending that P is true, all his behavior tends to indicate otherwise. He argues (convincingly) that what the fictionalist affirms in the critical context is what determines the beliefs he has all of the time. If the pretence were kept up full-time, then the only thing to distinguish this non-cognitive fictionalism from an expressivist position would be the fictionalist's internal mental states. And as the fictionalist is trying to pretend deeply, even to himself, that P is true, that may not be much of a difference. So the notion of a critical context allows Joyce's fictionalist the chance to pretend deeply, even lose himself in the pretense, that P is true, while still counting as believing that P is false. Secondly, Joyce may think that instructing his moral fictionalist to drop the pretence in the critical context will help to keep his epistemological powers ship-shape -- surely a wise thing to do, as loose or sloppy critical thinking would likely hurt his fictionalist elsewhere. Finally, note that this readiness to drop the pretence in some contexts helps to respond to the charge that the fictionalist is lying or deceiving others. If they wish to discuss the issue with him in a serious and critical way, then he will "'fess up" and be straight with them.

The tacit story operator version of revolutionary moral fictionalism says that after discovering that morality is an error, the best thing to do is to continue using our previous discourse but we should now interpret all talk of morality as loose, sloppy, or elliptical. For example, we should now interpret "Fred is good" as being a loose way of saying that according to story S, Fred is good. So why is this view not compatible with the notion of a critical context where our cognitive fictionalist admits that his previous claim was false? Joyce says "if what he said earlier concerned the content of the fiction … , then he does not think it was false at all". Let me say a couple of things in response. Firstly, the story operator view may not need the notion of a critical context to the same extent that Joyce does. There is already a clear sense in which he believes full-time that P is false. Secondly, it seems to me that the tacit story operator view does allow a critical context in a different sense -- a context in which he admits that what he said previously was loose, sloppy, or elliptical and liable to be misunderstood by others. This doesn't lead to any worries about his epistemological powers and will accommodate our intuition that he ought to 'fess up.

A third reason why Joyce might prefer a noncognitivist version of moral fictionalism is that his empirical argument for why we ought to adopt moral fictionalism may not work with a cognitivist version. One might find other benefits to be gained by adopting fictionalism, but for Joyce, the primary benefit is in generating guilty feelings that help you not to act unwisely. And it is the pretence that you are morally bad that is supposed to generate the guilty feelings. Initially it may not seem plausible that uttering something that means "according to the fiction you are morally bad" can also generate guilt. However, on reflection, I think it can. For all that Joyce has said, a tacit story operator view may work in just the same way as his noncognitivist view. If just hearing an advertisement can influence me to buy a box of soap powder, just saying "I am really bad" may be enough to rouse those guilty feelings, even if by "I am really bad" I mean, "according to story S, I am really bad". It seems that the habit of talking the talk is what is doing the work here rather than any additional features of the act of pretending. (I'm not even sure how phenomenologically different it is to say "I am really bad" and mean "According to story S, I am really bad", or to say "I am really bad" while pretending that story S is true. That may depend on your personal style of pretending. Is the difference that only in the latter case are you instructed to say it "with feeling"?)

Also relevant to the comparison between cognitivist and noncognitivist versions of revolutionary moral fictionalism is the advanced form of cognitivist fictionalism developed by Nolan in chapter 7. Fictionalism provides a way to talk like common people (i.e., all those realists about Fs). Nolan investigates extending this to pretending to have the beliefs, desires, and other attitudes of common people. This turns out to be harder than it sounds, especially when it comes to analyzing sentences about nested attitudes (e.g. I believe that she believes that there are Fs) and mixed situations, where fictionalists use vocabulary one way while non-fictionalists continue to use it in another. He works this out for cognitivist fictionalism, but the same kind of problem does not arise for noncognitivist fictionalism, as far as I can see. So in a way, Nolan provides a version of cognitivist fictionalism that even more closely resembles noncognitivist fictionalism.