Fictionalism in Philosophy

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Bradley Armour-Garb and Frederick Kroon (eds.), Fictionalism in Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2020, 237pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190689605.

Reviewed by Zoltán Gendler Szabó, Yale University


One day Winnie-the-Pooh decided to give Eeyore a birthday present. He picked up a small jar of honey from his pantry and took off towards the stream where Eeyore was. It was a warm day and a long way to go. About halfway Winnie felt that it was time for a little something and was delighted to find that he actually had a little something with him. He sat down, opened the jar, and only after the last lick did the consequences of his snack dawn on him. For a while he did not know what to do, but then he had a brilliant idea: "Well, it's a very nice pot, even if there's no honey in it, and if I washed it clean, and got somebody to write 'A Happy Birthday' on it, Eeyore could keep things in it, which might be Useful." Winnie carried on and offered the empty jar to Eeyore for his birthday with a small reminder of its real and proper function: "And it's for putting things in."

Fictionalists take their lesson from Chapter 6 of Winnie the Pooh. Just as a small jar might be useful even if one can no longer eat honey out of it, a nice theory might be useful even if one can no longer take it to be true. One can accept theories one does not believe, taking a mental note of what they are supposed to be for. For example, one can use physics to make predictions about macroscopic objects without believing in electrons, mathematics to facilitate scientific theorizing without believing in numbers, and ethics to combat weakness of the will without believing in values. Some traditionalists will insist that false physics, mathematics, or ethics are not what they are interested in, but perhaps eventually they too will appreciate them, just as they appreciate fiction, pretense, or make-belief. Things did work out for Eeyore as well: as it happens, he never liked honey anyway and he loved putting Piglet's balloon -- a small piece of damp rag -- in and out of Pooh's jar.

Fictionalism has been in the ascendancy for decades. It offers an attractive middle course between the positions advocated in one of the most impactful philosophical debates of the twentieth century. The guiding idea is that we can side with Carnap against Quine in thinking that there is a clear distinction between epistemic and pragmatic reasons for theory-choice, and with Quine against Carnap in maintaining that truth or falsity of a theory is in no way framework-relative. Belief must aim at the truth; acceptance can aim at utility. The central claim of fictionalism is that acceptance without belief is the apt attitude towards some theories. Criticism of fictionalism, accordingly, focuses on two broad issues: whether fictionalists can give a clear account of the attitude they advocate, and whether they can give principled reasons for selecting when this attitude is apt.[1] The ten essays of this volume provide excellent insight into the ways contemporary fictionalists, their sympathizers, and their critics are grappling with these issues.

Acceptance without belief is commonplace in the history of science. When anomalies appear in a well-functioning scientific paradigm, practitioners rarely rush to abandon their theory. Rather, they bracket the concerns and hope they will eventually be explained away. The theory is accepted with reservations, and hence, without outright belief. If the anomalies persist, they often lead to the development of a new theory that officially supersedes the old one. Yet, the old theory can remain in use, provided the new one shows that if used within certain bounds it delivers approximately correct predictions. The theory is accepted with qualifications, and hence, without outright belief.

It is often said, including by Chris Daly in his contribution to this volume, that the attitude fictionalists advocate is one of these (66-7). But, as John P. Burgess agues in his contribution, neither quite seems to fit the bill. Reservations about an accepted theory are but a phase in the scientific community and it is part of the professional training of scientists to learn when they can use a theory accepted only with qualifications (57-9). Fictionalists usually think the attitude they are advocating towards a theory is a stable condition that makes no difference to how practitioners engage with the theory.[2] Is there really such a form of acceptance without belief?

There is. As Carnap noted, a physicist who is suspicious of abstract entities will probably "speak about these things like anybody else, but with an uneasy conscience, like a man who in his everyday life does with qualms many things which are not in accord with the high moral principles he professes on Sundays" (1950: 20). The acceptance here is unreserved and unqualified -- our scientist does not hope that her qualms about abstracta will be dispelled by clever philosophical argument and is not in a possession of a nominalistic theory that could replace the problematic theory. Her uneasy conscience is a sign that what she actually accepts is not really acceptable by her own lights. The attitude fictionalists are after is not like this -- we are supposed to be able to accept a theory without belief, but also without qualms. Could that ever be a rational thing to do?

Maybe. In his contribution, Gideon Rosen describes two communities, R and F, whose scientists would be hard to tell apart on weekdays: they ask the same questions, they entertain the same answers, they agree about what theoretical virtues are, which theories have them, and to what extent (28-30). The differences come to the fore only on Sundays when they go to church and confess their beliefs. Those in R recite their realist creed ("we believe there are quarks, space-time, and bacteria") while those in F recite the fictionalist creed ("we believe that according to our best theories there are quarks, space-time, and bacteria but we do not believe those theories"). Rosen argues that the congregants in R and F might all tell the truth and that they might all be perfectly rational. It could be that their communities are bound by different epistemic norms, or it could be that both communities are subject to the same permissive epistemic norms. Either way, there is a step from acceptance to belief and reasonable people can disagree whether to take that step.

It is plausible that, even if we agreed on what makes one theory better than another, we might still rationally disagree on whether the best theory is good enough to believe. It is less plausible that we could come up with principles about what to do in this sort of situation. If the disagreement between realists and fictionalists is like the debate between those who think a 6'6'' basketball player is tall and those who think not, we might not want to invest much effort in its resolution. Rosen thinks the debate matters because the premises in practical reasoning need to be believed (45), and so, fictionalism is tenable only about theories one does not plan to rely on in action. Yet it is not entirely clear how immersing yourself in a theory you accept without belief is supposed to be different from relying on that theory in action.[3]

Like Rosen, Mary Leng has fictionalist sympathies that do not extend to views that are action guiding. In her contribution, she argues that despite superficial similarities, the case of moral fictionalism is much weaker than the case for mathematical fictionalism. Suppose the view advocated in Joyce (2001) is right -- we have no moral reasons to act, but acting in accordance with received moral principles does serve the long-term interests of members of a society with normal human desires. Joyce thinks this gives us good reason to accept those moral principles without belief. But while we might collectively have such a reason, those of us whose desires are aberrant do not, so in recommending this attitude for them the fictionalist would be outright deceptive (132-3). The mathematical fictionalist faces no similar challenge: she believes that accepting mathematics without belief is the apt attitude for everyone. I think Leng's point is well taken but not decisive. Joyce could point out that while the mathematical fictionalist offers advice she thinks happens to be good for everyone, she does not think it would be good for hypothetical beings of extraordinary capacity who can efficiently reason about the physical world without mathematical shortcuts. Good advice for them would be to discard mathematics altogether. The moral fictionalist's advice to those with abhorrent desires might similarly be to forget about morality. If that sounds harsh, the moral fictionalist could instead go ahead and recommend morality to everyone. That would be deceptive towards those with abhorrent desires but that might be just fine -- it is in our collective best interest that they should act against their own individual best interest.

Mark Balaguer's paper suggests that fictionalists about the existence of type-T objects should endorse the following four claims (154):

(1) There is a category of ordinary sentences that are best read as being about (or purporting to be about) Ts; but there are no such things as Ts, and so ordinary T-talk isn't true. (2) It doesn't matter is some sense whether Ts exist because even if they existed, they would be causally irrelevant and the world would look exactly the same to us regardless of whether Ts existed. (3) While ordinary T-talk isn't strictly true, there's still an important (and objective) sort of correctness that attaches to this talk; in particular, much of this talk is true in the story of Ts, where a sentence is true in the story of Ts iff it would have been true if (all of the) Ts had really existed. (4) We can use the facts mentioned in (2) and (3) to explain why our T-talk seems so obvious, why it's so useful, and why it's not harmful to our purposes that this talk isn't true.

There are elements in this characterization that could probably be relaxed: someone who rejects (1) because she is an agnostic about the Ts, or someone who rejects (4) because she thinks the explanations alluded to are incomplete might still be a fictionalist of the sort Balaguer has in mind. What is crucial is the response this characterization of fictionalism provides to the two challenges mentioned above. Acceptance of the (perhaps inchoate) theory behind the T-talk is a belief that the theory would have been true if the Ts had existed and we should adopt this attitude just in case the theory has all the usual virtues (empirical adequacy, predictive power, simplicity, etc.) even though the Ts are causally and observationally irrelevant.

This proposal has real virtues: unlike the others, it does not posit a new type of mental state (acceptance is outright belief -- no reservations, qualifications, pangs of conscience, or leaps of faith) and it clearly restricts the scope of fictionalism (for example, fictionalism about the causes of cancer is definitely out of bounds). But it also has significant limitations: it recommends fictionalism exclusively about entities that exist contingently but are causally inefficacious necessarily. It is not clear how many of the usual targets of fictionalism are like that. On traditional views, numbers or possible worlds exist or fail to exist necessarily, while artifacts or desires are contingent causes. The proposal clearly advocates fictionalism about rainbows and perhaps about qualia as well. To get beyond these, Balaguer needs to defend some controversial metaphysics -- as he is well aware (145).

This collection shows that fictionalists are far from united in what they recommend and why. They think that we should accept some theories without believing them but they don't seem to mean the same thing about what this attitude is supposed to be and when it is supposed to be apt. What underlies the diverse proposals beyond the label is the view that a theory has a more or less determinate subject matter, and that while the things it says or entails beyond its subject matter can make the theory false, this is not the sort of failure that should be held against it. I think this is a sensible view, provided it is not combined with dogmatic pronouncements about what the real or proper subject matter of a theory is -- like that mathematics is or should be about the physical world, that physics is or should be about what can observe, or that ethics is or should be about our prudential concerns.


Carnap, R. 1950. 'Empiricism, Semantics and Ontology.' Revue International de Philosophie 4: 20-40.

Joyce, R. 2001. The Myth of Morality. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

[1] Fictionalists advocate one of two contrary theses: according to hermeneutic fictionalists, we accept certain claims without belief; according to revolutionary fictionalists, we don't but we should. Hermeneutic fictionalism is a descriptive thesis compatible with the idea that accepting the relevant claims without belief is something we should not do. However, since I never met a hermeneutic fictionalist who thinks this and since the idea that the target theory is in good order is a motivation for fictionalism, I assume all fictionalists think acceptance without belief is the apt attitude for the target theory. 

[2] Roman Frigg and Fiora Salis argue in their contribution that something like acceptance with qualifications is the right attitude towards scientific models. This is plausible. However, models are not theories -- they are idealized scenarios articulated, relying on a background theory. Accepting them with qualifications amounts to believing that they correspond to a target scenario well enough for specific purposes.

[3] This is where the analogy with make-believe is supposed to help the fictionalist. We know we can immerse ourselves in the pretense that a tree stump is a bear and act accordingly. But pretense, being very much a passing attitude, is not a helpful analogy for the sort of stable acceptance without belief that fictionalists recommend.