Fictive Narrative Philosophy: How Fiction Can Act as Philosophy

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Michael Boylan, Fictive Narrative Philosophy: How Fiction Can Act as Philosophy, Routledge, 2019, 264pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138367333.

Reviewed by Karen Simecek, University of Warwick


In the latest addition to the Routledge Research in Aesthetics series, Michael Boylan presents a thesis on the use of narrative in philosophy; a pedagogy of fictive narrative or a 'narrative-based philosophy.' He argues that philosophical method and argumentation have been thought of in too limited a way as a priori deductive reasoning. His offering of 'fictive narrative philosophy' -- which is characterised as non-deductive and 'empirically suggestive indirect discourse' (p. 85) -- aims less at establishing universal, objective truths and more at philosophy as a personal project that shapes the way individuals think and act, which are essential for living well.

In making his case, Boylan seeks to demonstrate that philosophy has tended to overlook the role of literary devices such as narrative, character development, dialogue, and physical description as tools that can aid philosophy in its goals. He argues, the reason for not recognising the role of these literary devices is due to the particular way in which philosophy has attempted to understand art as something other than philosophy: 'In terms of the traditional paradigm, philosophy depicts art as different in kind as an object of human perception' (p. 27). The book is divided into two parts, with the first focused on providing a survey of the relationship between philosophy and art, or more precisely, how philosophy has conceptualised art. On such a paradigmatic view, he argues that 'art needs something different from philosophy: it needs some essential emotional tension' (p. 12), and in the context of figures such as Plato, it would seem that emotion being central to art sets it aside from the rationally focused project of philosophical inquiry. The second part focuses on presenting Boylan's positive view about how the relationship between philosophy and art (now understood as literature and fictional narrative) can provide a fruitful relationship, that is, how conceiving of philosophy and literature as overlapping categories can open up ways of understanding the nature of philosophy and philosophical argumentation.

Boylan argues that there has been a series of unchallenged assumptions regarding the appropriate mode of expression of philosophy (in some cases as a particular mode of writing), which seems to set philosophy apart from art and literature. In challenging such assumptions, it is surprising that Boylan does not focus on existing debates and discussions in the philosophy of literature. For instance, Martha Nussbaum's arguments for particularism and the role that engaging with fictional literature can play in enhancing moral understanding seems particularly relevant to this project. Also pertinent to Boylan's project is Tzachi Zamir's discussion of the role of aesthetic experience in argumentation and philosophical knowledge. Further, the large debate regarding the apparent incompatibility of poetry and philosophy has made a significant contribution in that it has lead to a distinction between philosophical writing and literature that is based on the two modes of expression having fundamentally different aims and concerns (Peter Lamarque is well known for making this case). Engagement with the existent literature would have significantly enhanced Boylan's discussion and helped to take a more sustained look at the aesthetics of such fictive narratives and how that is relevant to the philosophical project. Instead, what the book offers is a fairly reductive understanding of fictional narrative that doesn't capture the richness of such works and why we value them.

Having said that, Boylan does make an important contribution to the philosophy of literature by using his idea of the personal worldview to understand how we engage with fictive narrative philosophy and offering an explanation as to why that is pedagogically valuable. According to Boylan, a personal worldview is something we all carry with us that captures our individual set of beliefs and values that shape our thoughts and actions. This is very similar to the notion of a perspective that I (2015) and others have appealed to. And it is much like Bennett Helm's understanding of perspective that he outlines in Emotional Reason (2007); it is not something that can be isolated at any one time but instead is developed and constrained as one moves through time. Boylan highlights that there are normative demands on one's personal worldview in order to live one's life well, such as the need to achieve consistency, coherence and completeness, for which he acknowledges there is both a rational and emotional component: 'All people must develop a single comprehensive and internally coherent worldview that is good and that we strive to act out in our daily lives' (pp. 94, 221). He argues that what engagement with literature offers is alternative personal worldviews to engage with, that act as a point of reflection and can help make a contribution to self-knowledge:

devices functioning in fictive narrative philosophy should act toward some progression toward self-knowledge (gnothi seauton), which is one of the major goals of philosophy -- carried out by this philosopher via his personal worldview and shared community worldview imperatives. (p. 166)

Boylan highlights an important limitation of fictive narrative philosophy, namely, the thought experiment fallacy: the artificial nature of the example 'distorts our understanding of a practical outcome' (p. 85), and leads us to be susceptible to making false assumptions that are built in to the very set up of the thought experiment. Such thought experiments must be treated with caution. The conclusion we ought to draw from this fallacy is not a rejection of fictive narrative philosophy but a greater awareness of the role such fictive narratives ought to play in developing thinking and argumentation. In the context of the personal worldview, we are not engaging with fictive narratives in order to draw some objective truth but instead to put our own personal worldview to the test in order to reveal inconsistencies, incoherence and incompleteness:

When we consider a normative universe from a fictive example (the small: poems, cases, thought experiments -- to the large: novels, movies, plays), we are compelled to consider both its justification and our understanding of its application. Both need to be considered (i.e., the kind of world that would be created if we accepted the theory that underscores this possible world). (p. 98)

Another key contribution the book makes is a model of how we engage with new normative theories that helps to show the potential pedagogical function of narrative fiction:

Stage one: considering the theory; justifying the claim (point of contention)

Stage two: reflecting on our own worldview; comparing our worldview to the new theory; understanding the theory ((a) coinciding and amplification; (b) dissonance and rejection; (c) worldview overlap and modification)

Stage three: dialectical interaction (a form of reflective equilibrium); resolution (internalized by the individual).

Of course, not all narrative fiction will count as fictive narrative philosophy. What Boylan is pointing to is those works that draw on the constructional devices of narrative fiction in the service of a theme (which is related to the point of contention) or 'philosophical message.' In understanding fictive narrative philosophy, Boylan argues that there are constructional devices at work: '(1) A plot-driven narrative, (2) A character-driven narrative, (3) Physical description, (4) Dialogue, and (5) Narrative voice in expressing and executing the point of contention' (p. 116). This doesn't describe all narrative fiction, but what would be needed for narrative fiction to count as philosophical according to Boylan.

There are significant weaknesses if the book is taken to be primarily a work of aesthetics (I am surprised that it is included in the Routledge Research in Aesthetics series). These include the lack of acknowledgement of key theories and debates in the field and its associated methodologies. But taken in the spirit of making a contribution to philosophical pedagogy, many of the perceived weaknesses fall away and allow one to appreciate the book's contribution to understanding how fictive narratives can count as philosophical in aiding a thought process for an individual. This is especially so since one of the work's key contributions is an analysis of the structure and literary devices paradigmatic works of philosophy have made use of, a use that is somewhat overlooked in analytic philosophical journal articles about the limit of what philosophical writing is. Boylan offers a new conception of philosophical writing that has implications for how we understand the nature of argument and argumentation.

However, in terms of the book's thesis, it is far from clear what the first few sections contribute to the discussion by offering what strikes me as an introduction to an aesthetics course that doesn't fully engage with central works in the philosophy of literature. Although some key figures are mentioned (Aristotle, Plato, Nietzsche and Heidegger), there was an absence of those who have formed the backbone of contemporary philosophy of literature, most notably Nussbaum. But equally, there are a number of excellent works on both fiction and narrative (particularly Greg Currie's  Narratives and Narrators, 2010) that would have also been better starting points in helping to develop and expand the book's project. I worry that Boylan's characterisation of the field of aesthetics as not one of the core areas of philosophy but instead a 'philosophy of' (see p. 48) leads to an under-appreciation of the field that in turn leads to missing what it is to do aesthetics.

The book also contains a mysterious section on poetry (see p. 68). It is great to see poetry included under the banner of literature when too often literature is taken as interchangeable with the novel. However, it is important to recognise that poetry, although often making use of narrative, is not defined in terms of narrative; narrative is inessential. Furthermore, poetry also has an unusual relationship to fiction and truth, with many works of poetry being neither fiction nor non-fiction (authentic/inauthentic might be better descriptors), and so it was odd that Boylan didn't use poetry to complicate and extend the view of philosophy as narrative fiction.

Having said that, the latter parts of the book have much that's worth engaging with, and the idea of the personal worldview and how that characterises our engagement with narrative fiction is worth developing further. The book also contains a number of examples of works Boylan puts forward as philosophical narrative fictions such as The Handmaid's Tale, Invisible Man, The Picture of Dorian Gray, and War and Peace. for each He suggests for each how the logic of the work (the plot and character development) corresponds to methodological tools and features of paradigmatic philosophical works, such as appeal to Kantian categorical imperatives and Socratic dialogue. I encourage those who have expertise in aesthetics to engage with the ideas in an open and constructive way and seek to bring contemporary ideas of philosophy and literature to their reading to help do justice to the ideas in the book. It is easy to be critical and dismissive, but there is greater reward in trying to reach out and help develop the ideas of another. There is great potential here, but it remains just that, potential. But that represents an opportunity for readers to engage and develop.


Currie, G. Narratives and Narrators. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2010.

Helm, B. Emotional Reason. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007.

Lamarque, P. Poetry and Abstract Thought. Midwest Studies in Philosophy 33: 37-52, 2009.

Lamarque, P and S. H. Olsen. Truth, Fiction, and Literature: A Philosophical Perspective (paperback edition). Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1994

Nussbaum, M. Love's Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1990

Simecek, K. Beyond Narrative: Poetry, Emotion and the Perspectival View. British Journal of Aesthetics 55 (4), 497-513, 2015.

Zamir, T. Double Vision: Moral Philosophy and Shakespearean Drama. Oxford: Princeton University Press, 2007