Fields of Sense: A New Realist Ontology

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Markus Gabriel, Fields of Sense: A New Realist Ontology, Edinburgh University Press, 2015, 386pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780748692880.

Reviewed by Tom Sparrow, Slippery Rock University


Markus Gabriel's book is the most recent release in Edinburgh University Press's Speculative Realism series. It stands as a formidable installment in the contemporary resurgence of realism emerging from Europe, but Gabriel by no means limits his engagements to debates in so-called continental philosophy. While a cursory glance would classify him with speculative realists like Graham Harman and Quentin Meillassoux, Gabriel demonstrates that he is more than equipped to grapple, as he does, with a panoply of Anglo-American figures, from Frege and Kripke to Brandom and Boghassian. In his Introduction to New Realism (Polity, 2014), Maurizio Ferraris explicitly and quite specifically gathers Gabriel's view under the moniker New Realism, when he recounts the following anecdote:

New realism is one of the very few philosophical movements of which one may indicate the exact date and place of birth: it was 23 June 2011 at 13.30 at the restaurant "Al Vinacciolo" in Via Gennaro Serra 29, Naples. I can be so accurate because I was there, with Markus Gabriel and his Italian collaborator Simone Maestrone, after a seminar at the Italian Institute for Philosophy Studies. Markus was in the process of founding an international centre of philosophy in Bonn and wanted to inaugurate it with a big conference. I told him the right title would be "New Realism." I thought that name captured what in my opinion was the fundamental character of contemporary philosophy: that is, a certain weariness of postmodernism and the belief that everything is constructed by language, conceptual schemes and the media. Well, it is not like that . . . (Kindle edition, Loc 261)

The "new realism" in Gabriel's subtitle is not necessarily identical to the new realism championed by Ferraris -- the manner of argumentation, strategy, tone, and interlocutors differ -- but it shares the same spirit and offers a vibrant, invigorating tonic to those still hungover from the dominant trends in twentieth-century philosophy. Not unlike the texts of his occasional collaborator, Slavoj Žižek, Gabriel's book is not only intellectually rigorous, it is peppered with Žižek-style pop culture references and humor. It is genuinely entertaining at points, a fact that simply complements the provocation of its arguments. Which is not to say that Gabriel does not exhibit his own distinct style, which avoids many of the excesses familiar to readers of the Slovenian and exhibits a facility for presenting difficult ideas as if they were less than difficult. While this aids in consumption of the text, one must be on guard against mistaking what is complex for what is simple and must occasionally ask if Gabriel has not made the weaker argument appear stronger. Readers interested in both analytic and continental metaphysics, as well as German idealism, will find a lot to digest, and they should have a pleasant time reading what is to my mind a quite readable book that defines its terms and pithily characterizes the problems, positions, and debates it engages for those unfamiliar with them.

Unlike Mythology, Madness, and Laughter, the book he coauthored with Žižek (2009), and Transcendental Ontology (2013), Fields of Sense is less a book on German idealism that happens to include a number of original insights and much more an original ontological treatise. Furthermore, it is an expanded, more wide-ranging iteration of the issues and arguments that Gabriel introduced in his bestselling Why the World Does Not Exist, originally published in German in 2013 and delivered as a TEDx talk that same year. The newest book is divided into two halves, the first a "negative ontology" and the second a "positive ontology." Although, this is a bit misleading as there are a handful of affirmations and theses advanced in the first half and plenty of critical chiseling done in the second. The negative first half, which consists of seven chapters, identifies a number of enemies, including naturalism, materialism, physicalism, the mathematization of ontology (Badiou et al.), contemporary nihilism, and the correspondence theory of truth. The last of these chapters, the most constructive and pivotal, summarizes and sketches the "no-world-view" that gets fleshed out in the book's second half. Given that Gabriel is defending a version of realism, his no-world-view is not, of course, a rejection of the reality of the external world in the name of idealism, antirealism, or constructivism. It is the view that there is no entity or compilation of entities that answers to the label "the world." What exists, properly speaking, are objects and fields of sense, neither of which garner their existence from participation in the world. I will return to this theme after outlining the book's first half.

Most of the assumptions of contemporary metaphysics are "fundamentally flawed," argues Gabriel (5). This is the result of what he regards as the common collapse of metaphysics into ontology, two fields that must be kept separate. He understands ontology as the "systematic investigation into the meaning of 'existence'," whereas metaphysics attempts to give an account of the difference between reality and appearance, on the one hand, and to provide a "theory of totality" or a picture of "the world as world," on the other (5-6). Gabriel's book is resolutely a work of ontology, in part because he simply rejects the idea that metaphysics is a meaningful enterprise. Indeed, as defined here, metaphysics is impossible because the world lacks existence; ontology, as defined and conducted here, discloses this clearly.

Gabriel proposes the name "meta-metaphysical nihilism" (the no-world-view) for the realist view he defends. This is "the view that metaphysics literally talks about nothing, that there is no object or domain it refers to" (7). To be clear, however, this is a species of ontological realism and, to be sure, not the old variety. The difference is that Gabriel's realism is not characterized by its commitment to the mind-independent external world but by its affirmation that any perspective on mind-independent objects is as real and unconstructed as the objects themselves. The problem with old realism and constructivist antirealism is that the former cannot account for the independence of the mind itself since by its definition the mind is mind-dependent, while the latter is premised, somewhat inconsistently, on the idea that there is something "out there" for the mind to construct (10-11).On this last point Gabriel notes his affinity Boghossian's critique of constructivism and epistemological relativism in Fear of Knowledge.

Chapter 1, "Zoontology," lays out the terms of ontology by rejecting zoontology as the ground of ontology (39). At first glance zoontology looks like nothing more than anthropomorphic naturalism, which would reduce the domain of what is to the domain of whatever can be known by humans given their specific, biologically-determined epistemic capacities. But there is more to it. Zoontology, generally speaking, is the ontology of life, but "life" understood as the very ground of ontology, whether naturalistic or phenomenological. It holds that the meaning of being, or existence, can only be grasped once the meaning and limits of human being have been deciphered. For Gabriel, this is effectively what Heidegger argues in Being and Time and what motivates "scientistic naturalism," or the view that "nature" designates the totality of individuals extended in space-time and that this totality, which excludes human rationality, exhausts the domain of the really real (34-35). The danger of zoontology is that it encourages us to "overestimate our position as special knowers in our planet 'zoo'" and "leads to thinking that ontology is generally somehow constrained or governed by features of human development or rationality" (34). In Meillassoux's language, zoontology is a correlationist trap that entices us into overlooking the fact that there are facts about the world which have nothing to do with what humans desire, intend, or care about.

Chapter 2 deploys an argument against existence as a "proper property," which Gabriel defines as "a property reference to which puts one in a position to distinguish an object in a domain from another or from some other objects in the domain" (43). This line of argument is crucial to advancing the claim that, despite the nonexistence of the world, it is still possible to distinguish between what does and does not exist and to distinguish between facts, fictions, and falsehoods. Gabriel examines some extant arguments, including Kant's, to the effect that existence is not a proper property (or real predicate). He contrasts proper properties with metaphysical and logical properties in order to show that existence is not something that belongs exclusively to things, which would entail that everything exists. His purpose here is to respond to Kant, Meinong, Russell and others by showing that existence is an ontological property, neither proper, metaphysical, nor logical. To exist, for Gabriel, is to appear in a domain, or to appear in what he calls a "field of sense," which we will return to later (44). Existence, then, is not something that belongs to individuals themselves, but a property of individuals that appears within a given domain; existence will differ between domains, which implies that what it means to exist is field-relative (60-61). This is not to say that for individuals to exist they must appear to someone or something capable of representing them but that they must appear in relation to other objects within that field.[JH1]  It also does not mean that existence is entirely dependent on the field in which something appears but rather that existence only makes sense when we are talking about individuals appearing within a given field (65). The sense of existence, ontology itself, is never about independent individuals or "empty" fields: fields and objects exist codependently, and neither is more real than the other. This is not to say that every individual and every field exists together, at the same time and in the same way, just that there is no a priori way of determining what exists as an "actual individual" as opposed to a "mere mereological sum" (52).

Even though Gabriel is clearly already building his own no-world-view, Chapter 3 continues the negative ontological work by criticizing Kant's and Frege's views on existence, while Chapter 4 launches an offensive against the set-theoretical ontology of Badiou and its complicity with contemporary nihilism. Kant's rejection of existence as a real, as opposed to logical, predicate rests on a conception of the world as a totality, a unified spatiotemporal "field of possible experience" that recognizes as actual only those individuals that are themselves (possibly) spatiotemporal (53). Since no such field exists, this cannot adequately account for the meaning of existence (73). Frege, on the other hand, is shown to present an excessively formal and mathematized account of existence that does not get at the objective, language-user-independent sense of existence required for a realist ontology. Gabriel helpfully summarizes, in chart form, what is fascinatingly wrong (and right) about Kant and Frege on existence (101-102). For his part, Badiou, following Cantor, is found guilty of peddling an inadequate mathematical formalism in the same vein as Frege. Gabriel classifies this as obvious ontotheology (130) and takes it to task for masquerading as a genuine ontology of the real rather than the inadequate formalism that it is. As Gabriel says,

What I am attacking is the idea that existence is significantly related to quantifiable individuation, whether the objects thus counted are substances, events, or absolute processes. I reject the idea that to be is to be one or a one, a unified object, be it unified in itself or unified by thought, language, discursive practices, the symbolic order, the neurochemistry of what we think of as intentionality or what have you (105).

This attack applies as much to Badiou as it does to Frege, Kant, and Quine.

Gabriel fills out his understanding of the term "field" in Chapter 6. There he tells us that the term is a synonym for "domain" and one that he has chosen in order to differentiate his position from both traditional domain ontology and set-theoretical ontology. The problem with traditional domain ontology is that "it is premised on transcendental asymmetry," which entails the idealist principle that thought itself determines the truth conditions of thought but not the conditions of truth itself (148, 157). "The essence of transcendental asymmetry," writes Gabriel, "is a very general form of internalism according to which domains of objects (logical horizons) are constructed, whereas the objects appearing within the domains usually are encountered" (148-149). As a realist, Gabriel must reject this premise of traditional domain ontology. He replaces it with a position -- devoid of the metaphysical assumptions of domain and set-theoretical ontology -- which asserts the unconstructed nature of domains, now called fields:

Fields are generally unconstructed, and their force is felt by the objects entering them. . . . The field provides objective structures and interacts with the objects appearing within it. It is already there, and objects can pass through it and change its properties. Fields are not horizons or perspectives; they are not epistemological entities or objects introduced to explain how we can know how things are (157-158).

Anything that exists appears in a field. For this to happen, a field must exist. But this implies that the field itself appears within a field, "and so on infinitely" (159). There are, then, a plurality of fields. If there were only one field, it would be universal and everything would appear within it. It would be the world, which does not and cannot exist (159). What exists is what appears in a field, which means that what exists are relations between objects (real or fictional) and fields.

This emphasis on relations, rather than objects, places a certain distance between the new realist ontology of Gabriel and the object-oriented ontology of Graham Harman. Gabriel likewise distances himself from the "modes of existence" ontology of Bruno Latour, Harman's occasional ally. Fiction and reality, for example, are not two modes of existence, as if the fictional and the real stand for two separate domains of existence. They are, on the contrary, two fields of sense. Their difference is a functional one, not modal; the same goes for the distinction between appearance and reality. Which is not to say that all things appear in the same way; objects appear in different forms (171-172). But all of these forms are forms of appearance, of what it means to exist. This is why it is not inaccurate to classify Gabriel as a "flat" ontologist, although not without some qualification, which the author himself provides.

The final negative-ontological chapter (Chapter 7) gathers and recapitulates the claims of the no-world-view, which Gabriel calls the "heart of the matter" (187). He addresses, in turn, three objections that have been raised against his view: that his ontology is local and therefore finite (189-192); that his definition of existence is "inherently universal" (192-201); and that his assertion of the world's nonexistence, if it were true, would imply that the world does exist (201-207). Gabriel delivers satisfying replies to these objections and along the way draws out a telling contrast with phenomenology, particularly the Heideggerian variety, which he regards as fundamentally antirealist. Heidegger's antirealism is unsatisfying because, argues Gabriel, we can know a priori not only that there are fields of sense, and therefore objects and object relations within them, but that there are many fields of sense. What appears within them, however, can only be determined after the fact (207). This is why Gabriel identifies himself as an ontological pluralist, a pluralist about existence (191).

By the time readers get to the positive ontology (Chapters 8-13), they already have a good idea of where Gabriel stands and how he came to stand there. The second part of the book is, perhaps, more constructive than the first insofar as its dialectical presentation unpacks more of Gabriel's own theses. There are two chapters on modality (Chapters 10 and 11) and two on epistemology, wherein Gabriel defends a version of epistemological pluralism (Chapters 12 and 13), none of which will I discuss in detail.

Chapter 8 cashes out the idea that there are indefinitely many fields of sense. Gabriel has also asserted (see above) that there are infinitely many fields of sense, so there is some nonfatal ambiguity in his position. Nevertheless, this chapter not only makes the case for the plurality of fields of sense and the case that we can know of this plurality a priori, it also argues that the world is the only thing that necessarily does not exist (214 ff.). We get a more precise account of the meaning of "sense," initially introduced as the rules for individuating a domain (139), as well as a case for the priority of sense over concept; "object" and "individual" are likewise fleshed out. One of the book's chief virtues is Gabriel's consideration of  the readers. He never assumes too much of them, which means that his presentation rarely, if ever, exploits their ignorance of the matter at hand. The chapter also stages substantial engagements with Kripke and Hegel.

Readers of Harman, Manuel DeLanda, Jane Bennett, and Levi Bryant will be interested in Chapter 9, where Gabriel asks "How Flat Can Ontology Be?" and answers that it cannot be as flat as some might think. There are at least as many versions of flat ontology as there are proper names in the opening sentence of this paragraph. All of them challenge the kind of hierarchized ontology typical of ontotheology, however. Gabriel's ontology claims that "all fields of sense are equal insofar as they are fields of sense" (252). This is a clear rejoinder to Harman's version of flat ontology, for which all objects are equal insofar as they are objects. This is not equivalent to the claim that all objects exist equally, no matter what their scale or what domain they belong to, factual or fantastic. Gabriel also presents an alternative to DeLanda's flat ontology, which Gabriel quite succinctly sets aside by noting that it is a flat metaphysics, not a flat ontology (252). One may wish to quibble with him here, perhaps about the definition of metaphysics. Now, while Gabriel wants to oppose hierarchical ontology, his view compels him to resist a completely flat ontology precisely because, as he says, "it is impossible for there to only be a unified level (a plane of immanence, as it were, to misuse Deleuze's metaphor) of equal objects that happen to differ from each other in one way or other (most likely by their properties)" (255). The so-called "curving" of flat ontology is necessitated, he maintains, by the functional difference between fields of sense and objects alluded to earlier: some things are objects within a field and simultaneously a field in which objects appear, and there is a sense in which fields take priority over objects even though both are necessary for something to appear, to exist. In short, "What serves as a field of sense and what serves as an object is not fixed by any transcendental standards, but negotiated on a case by case basis" (258).

At times, when I was in the thick of Gabriel's book, I found myself wishing I was instead tasked with reviewing the briefer Why the World Does Not Exist or, in especially weak moments, his TEDx talk. Some of the tangents and ancillary discussions veer into terrain that others more steeped in analytic metaphysics debates will find more compelling than I do. Occasionally it seemed like the substance of the no-world-view had already been established, and yet the book continued on to discuss matters that seemed of only secondary interest. I wanted to repose in satisfaction, having gleaned the big picture and navigated through a number of rewarding, yet taxing, passages. Several skirmishes remained to be decided, however. But I suspect that many reviewers experience such desires and feelings while working their way through a tightly argued and incisive ontological treatise that demands their attention as it unfolds an extraordinary vision of what does and does not exist and how we can know about these. Fields of Sense is required reading for anyone coming to grips with contemporary metaphysics, no matter which philosophical tradition they call their own.