Film, Art, and the Third Culture: A Naturalized Aesthetics of Film

Placeholder book cover

Murray Smith, Film, Art, and the Third Culture: A Naturalized Aesthetics of Film, Oxford University Press, 2017, 294pp., $46.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780198790648.

Reviewed by Trevor Ponech, McGill University


At the end of his fascinating insider's tour of a third research culture at a crossroads of the humanities and natural sciences, Murray Smith reminds readers of a guiding precept that many in his core audience of philosophical aestheticians and cognitivist cinema scholars will have already endorsed before the expedition began. "Good empirical research," he says, "requires attention to its conceptual scaffolding, and good philosophical theorizing demands alertness to the relevance of empirical findings about the world" (223). The kind of regulated cross-border trade Smith envisages is partly facilitated by a recent wave of cognitive neuroscientific experimental investigations of movie spectatorship, including studies of empathy and emotional responsivity. Smith's "third culture" recognizes that our experiences of artworks are natural phenomena. It does not make cinema scholars and philosophers into brain scientists and evolutionary biologists, just knowledgeable interlocutors in dialogues about the methods, principles, and disputes emerging from the cognitive and neurophysiological sciences. Beyond curiosity about and amenability to experimental results, they bring to the exchange the gift of nous. They can direct investigators toward important topics and puzzles in aesthetics and moving image studies that might be illuminated or resolved by natural scientific findings. They can help identify objects of study and units of analysis, and reflect insightfully upon the nature of these objects. They can analyze and synthesize empirical evidence and scientific hypotheses with a view to formulating explanatory utterances intelligible to all inquirers operating within the compass of naturalized aesthetics. These sorts of philosophical contributions ostensibly supply the conceptual scaffolding upon which scientists and theorists of the third culture likewise stand. My review focusses on some of that structure's inherent strengths and vulnerabilities.

Within the integrated research environment Smith advocates, humanities scholars remain in charge of aesthetic, moral, and political ruminations, free, ostensibly unlike scientists, to reflect upon good and bad, what ought or ought not be, rather than simply refer to what is (4-5). His naturalization program in aesthetics nonetheless asks theorists to "hold evaluation at bay" by prioritizing description and explanation (53). Smith seems to believe that insofar as theorists aspire to the "truth-tracking" goals of science, value judgments are "things to be transcended" (54). A subtle formulation of the value-freedom doctrine would comprehend, along with the inevitable ways in which value commitments orient research, core truths about the distorting influence on rational inquiry of wishful and fearful thinking, dogma, superstition, and tribalism. Yet it needn't incorporate value irrealism and question-begging blanket denials that value judgments are ever true or rationally compelling based on empirical evidence. Nor do all such formulations deny that adequate explanations within the anthropological sciences can involve value judgments as the explanans.[1] It might be especially hard to disengage philosophical aesthetics from evaluation. Smith recognizes that its objects of study perforce include values and assessments (53). The problem, though, turns on the issue of whether philosophical aesthetics has a constitutive cognitive interest in discerning kinds of aesthetic and artistic value, explaining their sources, and testing the reality of works' merits and defects. There is plenty to debate about the ontology of values and whether they are any less (or more) real than chairs, colors, extended phenotypes, eigenstates, money, or fictional characters. It is not obvious that aesthetic philosophers who are also committed naturalists must or, practically speaking, can effectively and with good reason disconnect themselves either from these axiological debates or pursuit and appreciation of value.

Smith's approach to modelling the epistemic rewards of a naturalized aesthetics is sensitive to what he calls art's "expansiveness," understood as its abilities "to stress and stretch our perceptual, cognitive, and emotional capacities" (122). In chapter four, for instance, Smith shows that there is a mutually illuminating relationship between cognitive neuroscientific investigations of the qualitative dimensions of perception and certain carefully selected artistic exercises in defamiliarization. Here, as throughout his book, his cinematic erudition and formalist prowess significantly enrich discussion. Ozu Yasujiro's The Flavor of Green Tea Over Rice (1952) and Stan Brahkage's abstract expressionist movies, such as Rage Net (1988), serve to illustrate theories about what it is to have a potentially ineffable qualitative conscious awareness of -- over and above mere reception of information about -- some object, activity, or experience. Ozu's work gives us a taste not so much of the eponymous meal as what it is like when a simple sensation evokes afresh a network of memories, associations, and feelings. Brakhage's films confect strikingly novel visual experiences that thwart our evolved disposition to individuate objects in visual arrays. Whereas Ozu's ambition is to renew our acquaintance with a familiar, quintessentially human experience, Brakhage tries to afford viewers new perceptual qualia specific and unique to his manipulations of the cinematic medium. Smith holds that certain cinematic and other artworks manifest a distinctive epistemological value, insofar as they provide phenomenal knowledge by acquaintance of human perceptual and cognitive experiences (118). Theorists would be right to ponder the implications of the epistemic merit Smith attributes to works by Ozu, Brakhage, and others, inclusive of their possible heuristic role in helping researchers illustrate and clarify their ideas about consciousness. In claiming that some artworks are markedly good for promoting awareness and knowledge of qualia, the philosophically naturalistic theorist turns out to have much to offer to, and a substantial stake in, rational-empirical inquiry into whether there are features, including epistemic ones, in virtue of which some works are artistically valuable in some particular way.

Although replete with cinematic culture, Smith's naturalized aesthetics aims for full explanation rather than critical interpretive appreciation, broadly conceived. Part I of his book lays out his framework of epistemological principles. Given that he identifies explanation with "the domain of causal interaction" (33), Smith seems to associate it with something along the lines of sufficiently deep description of causes helping to bring about something's occurrence or existence. His own preferred causal pattern perforce moves "'downwards', into the subpersonal domain 'beneath' intentionality" (52). Yet Smith also accepts that beliefs, desires, intentions, and other personal, introspectable mental items are natural causes, hence can figure in explanations. Certain versions of intentionalist interpretation therefore count as explanatory (36). This acknowledgement of the vagueness of the border between explanation and humanistic understanding is noteworthy. It gestures toward the existence of modes of humanistic inquiry that lack the explanatory "thickness" Smith seeks but that nonetheless cohere with naturalism and yield substantially illuminating, true, and epistemically secure beliefs about works' semantic properties and makers' expressive and artistic intentions, plans, and accomplishments.

Smith links explanatory thickness with greater completeness as well as depth. Beyond describing the neurophysical structures and events upon which various cognitive processes and aesthetic experiences "supervene," thickness also requires triangulation: mutually supportive phenomenological, psychological, and neural evidence (68). Consider the puzzle of anomalous suspense, that is, suspense despite already knowing what happens in a narrative (69-72). Suppose that future neuroscientific research eventually establishes that underlying patterns of neural activity characteristic of prototypical suspense occur in recidivist episodes, when the subject reliably reports both knowing the story's outcome and feeling suspenseful anxiety. This neural activity would not itself identify what suspense is, pinpoint its causes, and confirm that anomalous suspense is real. Instead, explanation depends on specifying that suspense incorporates felt emotional states of certain kinds, the sources and drivers of which are relatively automatic bottom-up processes in reaction to stimuli, where these processes are potentially isolated from higher-level cognitive information such as background beliefs about story content. Thus all three "levels" -- phenomenological, psychological, neural -- figure in the explanation. Notice that Smith's method is perhaps equally well described as quadrangulation, in light of its attunement to myriad formal and perceptible features -- shot composition, framing, image and sound editing, musical cues, and so on -- by which movies trigger cascades of responses eventuating in sensory, cognitive, affective, and emotional experiences.

In part II, Smith advances the Darwinian claim that evolution has endowed viewers with dependable capacities to recognize facial expressions and mimic the emotions these register -- an adaptation allowing conspecifics living in social groups to sense, categorize, and react advantageously to one another's affective states. Cinematic artists, without knowing the science, exploit the mechanisms of the underlying mirror neuron system, the activation of which helps to explain the immediacy, intensity, and character of audiences' affective mimicry, emotional contagion, and full-on empathy in response to narrative fictions.[2] Smith's important explanation in chapter seven of what empathy is and how audiences come to experience it revolves around the idea that one's more rather than less automatic, involuntary, pre-cognitive neurophysiological and somatic responses sometimes mirror the neural, motor, and affective states of another. This "sub-imaginative" mimicry might initiate and "scaffold" a more cognitively robust imaginative qua mimetic engagement in which one acquires not only information about what a real or fictive agent perceives, thinks, and feels, but a direct acquaintance with what it is like for that agent to perceive, think, or feel as they do. A careful analysis of, for example, Strangers on a Train (Alfred Hitchcock, 1951) shows how the makers aim to give us a taste of what it is like to be tennis star Guy and his psychopathic nemesis Bruno by deploying, inter alia, facial close-ups progressively crosscut with close shots of motor actions involved in playing an intense tennis match and straining to retrieve a small precious object almost out of hand's reach (180-82). Smith leaves no doubt that Hitchcock and his artistic collaborators created a movie scene apt to arouse palpable, engrossing concern with the exertions and worries of these two desperate characters.

However, it is not obvious that adequacy of explanation within naturalized aesthetics depends on reference to the hypothesized neural underpinnings of empathic and other affectively-hued responses to fictions. A skeptic might believe that an episode of empathy owes its existence to some neural network, N; and that facts about these microconstituent spatial parts of the brain are facts about how this instance of empathy occurs. To take this attitude is not, of course, automatically to believe that empathy is identical to, nothing over and above N. Smith himself eschews reduction, instead holding that empathy supervenes on N (65).[3] He does not say what he supposes supervenience to be and why it is not a philosopher's magic carpet to nowhere.[4] But a skeptic could further hold that empathy, as a complex property of agents, is much like pain as a property of creatures or red as a property of surfaces. Notwithstanding the similarities between particular instances of empathy (or pain, or red), there is a potentially long, disjunctive list of microphysical constituents and structures involved in manifestations of such properties. N and another microstructure, N*, might be similar mostly in virtue of the clusters of properties they bear, those being the ways of thinking and feeling that we take to be characteristic of empathy and that we track when we discern episodes of it. If so, facts about N thicken the explanation without necessarily making it a more illuminating, truthful, epistemically secure analysis of what empathy is, how artists can contrive to elicit it, what its merits are, and what the differences are between empathy for real people and empathy for known fictive entities like Guy and Bruno.

One of the most inspiring aspects of the book is the delicate balance its author achieves between broad, deep cinema scholarship and natural-scientifically disciplined, philosophically sophisticated research into aesthetics. It is worth noting the context of this achievement. Smith is by training steeped in cinema studies' commitments to formalism and history, along with its interests in the perceptual, psychological, and phenomenological dimensions of spectatorship. He is also, as it were, stealing off from academic cinema studies with these goods. His ambition seems much less to reconstruct that field according to naturalistic principles than to establish a new avenue of humanistic inquiry into cinema that is not a conduit for orthodox but problematic theoretical commitments to psychoanalysis, semiotics, Marxism, poststructuralism, culturalism, and so forth. He is likewise repudiating many critics' and theorists' interpretive priorities in relation to cinema, literature, and the cultural conditions thought to generate items of such kinds. Interpretation in the humanities is multifarious, but often blends formal analysis with virtuoso "close reading" of implicit and esoteric meanings, where the whole value-laden enterprise is likely to be a vehicle for belle-lettristic evocations of interpretive objects' aesthetic qualities, and for politically progressive critiques of ideologically-suffused historical and cultural forces supposedly embodied in these objects' form, content, and construction. It is not obvious which plot of institutional terrain would be most fertile for a naturalized aesthetics of cinema. Philosophical aesthetics is much more hospitable to this sort of project, even amid debates about whether and to what extent it should imitate natural science. Yet academic cinema studies will likely remain the core space of expertise in which to train future Murray Smiths in the formal, historical, and comparative knowledge of cinema on which the third culture depends.

No matter where its seeds fall and germinate, the book is a landmark development in the growing relation between aesthetic philosophy, moving image studies, and cognitive-scientific theories of cinema and other arts.


Flanagan, Owen. 1992. Consciousness Reconsidered. MIT Press.

Heil, John. 2003. From an Ontological Point of View. Oxford University Press.

Martin, Charles B. 2008. The Mind in Nature. Oxford University Press.

Miller, Richard W. 1987. Fact and Method: Explanation, Confirmation and Reality in the Natural and Social Sciences. Princeton University Press.

Rizzolatti, Giacomo and Corrado Sinigaglia. 2006. Mirrors in the Brain: How Our Minds Share Actions and Emotions, trans. Frances Anderson. Oxford University Press.

[1] Miller (1987: 106-113) offers a measured defence of the role of evaluation in explanatory statements.

[2] Mirror neurons are neurons that are activated whenever either an agent performs an action or observes someone else's performance of an action of that type. See Rizzolatti and Sinigaglia (2006). Smith is conversant with the debates about the evidence for and implications of mirror neuron theory (238, note 42).

[3] Smith's thinking in this connection is grounded in that of Flanagan (1992).

[4] Trenchant critiques of the concept of supervenience are to be found in Martin (2008) and Heil (2003).