Finding Freedom: Hegel's Philosophy and the Emancipation of Women

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Sara MacDonald, Finding Freedom: Hegel's Philosophy and the Emancipation of Women, McGill-Queen's University Press, 2008, 156pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780773533752.

Reviewed by Lydia Moland, Colby College


Four paragraphs before concluding the lecture series known as Aesthetics: Lectures on Fine Art (which, in its English translation, numbers 1237 pages), Hegel claims that "the modern world has developed a type of comedy which is truly comical and truly poetic." He adds: "As a brilliant example of this sort of thing I will name Shakespeare once again, in conclusion, but without going into detail" (1236). Three paragraphs later, the entire lecture series concludes. Meticulous readers might be forgiven for feeling aggrieved; they will at this point have waded patiently through any number of much less intriguing discussions. In earlier passages, Hegel for instance gives careful attention to Doric and Ionic columns; he considers the spiritual value of precious stones in sculpture; he contemplates in some detail the aesthetic value of Zoroastrianism. Hegel was a voracious reader and often refers to literary texts. Surely he could have expanded on Shakespeare and modern comedy, and surely it would have been fascinating. It is the great virtue of Sara MacDonald's new book, entitled Finding Freedom: Hegel's Philosophy and the Emancipation of Women, that it breathes life into Hegel's tantalizingly elliptical tribute to Shakespeare. In taking Hegel's praise seriously, MacDonald contributes not only to our understanding of Hegel's aesthetics, but to its place in his political philosophy and particularly the place of women in that political philosophy.

MacDonald builds towards her Shakespearean thesis by first reminding us that the trio of art, women, and political philosophy in fact recurs throughout Hegel's philosophy. It does so in the person of Antigone, Sophocles' tragic heroine. In the interest of drawing both parallels and distinctions between tragedy as exemplified in Antigone and Shakespeare's comedies, MacDonald first spends two chapters analyzing Hegel's reading of Sophocles' play. This is extremely well-trodden territory in Hegel scholarship; indeed, Hegel's reading of Antigone has become one of the standard means of interpreting this classic tragedy. More recently, however, significant attention has also been given to how Hegel misreads the play.[1] MacDonald allies herself with those who find Hegel's reading of Antigone misleading, but she is not content to point out the discrepancies between Sophocles' play and Hegel's analysis. Instead, she claims that Hegel's misconstrual of Antigone is deliberate, intended to make a point. What then are these misconstruals, and what is their point?

To take one example: Antigone for Hegel represents the particular. In her obsession with her brother, she is unable (or unwilling) to consider the universal concerns of the state. But, protests MacDonald, Antigone precisely does not recognize her brother's particularity but "remains rooted in the universal of the family" (68); she does not interact with Polynices as Polynices, but through the universal category of "brother." To take another: Antigone according to Hegel represents the intuitive, the unconscious, the instinctive. MacDonald points out that Creon's decree that Polynices not be buried in fact forces Antigone "to confront her actions and consciously choose to follow her own will" (68). Her actions are then not intuitive but calculated. Finally: Hegel suggests that ancient Greek ethical life was destroyed by the acknowledgement, wrung out of Antigone and Creon's struggle, that both sides were guilty. MacDonald objects that Antigone's admission of her guilt is qualified at best and that Hegel never takes up Creon's more explicit acknowledgement of his guilt. Why would Hegel misrepresent one side of the conflict and ignore the other?

MacDonald sees a method in this madness. Each of Hegel's changes, she claims, "has the effect of making the individual more compliant to the state" (70); "in each case, the family is incorporated into and recognizes the importance of the political community" (71) but not vice versa. In other words, Hegel misrepresents Antigone's attachment to Polynices, overemphasizes the intuitive nature of her action, and ignores Creon's acknowledgment of his wrong all in order to depict what happens when the state turns a blind eye to its citizens' particularity. The net effect is to suggest to us how destructive such repression of particularity can be: "[Hegel's] poetry, in comparison to the historic play, shows us the significance of individual subjectivity and the need of the political community to incorporate these interests as its own" (71). I admit to worrying that such a deliberate misreading seems too clever by half, even for Hegel. It certainly presupposes enormous faith in his readers on Hegel's part: faith not only in their meticulous analysis of his work but in their knowledge of Sophocles' play. But I think MacDonald's overarching point is plausible. Antigone is on one level a cautionary tale about the suppression of particularity in the political context.

In Chapter 4, MacDonald suggests that in Hegel's more mature work, Elements of the Philosophy of Right, this commentary on the importance of subjectivity continues. There we see in fact that "the rights of the individual have not been truly recognized" even in the rational state as Hegel portrays it (75).[2] A case in point is Hegel's relegation of women to the sphere of the family. Here MacDonald seems to be using her title, Finding Freedom, as a kind of search warrant. And indeed, scouting for evidence of women's freedom in Hegel's philosophy is a daunting task. Hegel reinforces many of the assumptions about women's inferiority prevalent in the history of Western philosophy, famously, in the Philosophy of Right, comparing them to plants. Nevertheless, in Chapter 4, MacDonald conducts this search on two levels. First, she reminds us of a few progressive-sounding claims in the Philosophy of Right: Hegel was not against the education of girls; he supported limited property rights for women; he shows consciousness of the constraints placed on women by their financial dependence on men (92-5).

Second, on a more systematic level, MacDonald argues that Hegel's own logic is inconsistent in its confining of women to the familial sphere. Hegel for instance suggests that "[t]he natural determinacy of the two sexes acquires an intellectual and ethical significance by virtue of its rationality" (PR §165; emphasis in Hegel's original text). In other words, the natural differences between men and women determine their role in the ethical sphere: women remain confined to the family, men progress to civil society and the state. It is, MacDonald claims, "strange that Hegel is willing to base an ethical distinction on characteristics that are purely natural, such as biological facts, even if they serve a rational end" (87-8). It would be "more consistent for him to argue that the ethical world should be raised above the purely contingent nature of our physical beings" (88). Responding to Hegel's claim that "[w]hen women are in charge, the state is in danger" since women base their actions on the particular rather than the universal, MacDonald argues that this is inconsistent with his own illustration of how women think universally within the family.

I worry that in both of these claims, MacDonald is overly optimistic. To take the second claim first: universal thought within the family is qualitatively different from the universal thought Hegel portrays as necessary in the state. Universality within the family consists in the ability of family members to take each other's good into account. Within the state, universality requires abstract knowledge of laws and principles. Women in Hegel's view are capable of the first but not the second. Second: Hegel's scheme involves many natural determinations that have ethical significance. These include, as he discusses in the Philosophy of Spirit, a person's natural temperament, age, and, most notoriously, national characteristics (§§393-7). All of the above can and should be shaped and given context by the individual's will; we are not determined to be only who we naturally are. But neither can we escape these inherited components of who we are. In The Philosophy of History, Hegel claims that

[e]ach individual is the son of his nation and at the same time, to the extent that his state is conceptualized through its development, the son of his time. No one remains behind, much less does anyone jump ahead. This spiritual essence is his, he is a representative of it; it is that out of which he develops and within which he stands. (52)

Hegel, I think, very much sees our natural determinations as having ethical significance. Both regarding universal thought and natural determinations, then, the place to attack Hegel is not on inconsistencies in his logic but on mistaken claims of fact. It is simply wrong to say that women are less rational than men or incapable of thinking universally at the level of the state. As long as Hegel clings to such inaccuracies, his conclusions will be wrong however consistent his logic.

Be that as it may: it is certainly true that the modern state as portrayed in the Philosophy of Right continues to deny women's subjectivity. The lessons of Antigone have not been fully absorbed, resulting in the exclusion of women from the political sphere and presenting "a continued source of tension between the family and the state." In this way, suggests MacDonald, "although perhaps not intentionally, [Hegel] identifies an area for the further realization of Spirit within the world" (77). We must, in other words, continue with Hegel's argument where he left off: we should recognize that there is room in Spirit's development for further emancipation of women. How is this ideal of freedom to be reached? Given that the world of the Philosophy of Right has yet to achieve this freedom, where should we look for a model of how it might work?

In the book's fifth chapter, MacDonald suggests that "given Hegel's own reliance on examples from works of art to mediate the development of our understanding, it seems that we are justified in seeking works of art that better reflect the Spirit as it is presently manifest" (99). MacDonald takes on this challenge, turning to Shakespeare's A Midsummer Night's Dream to fill out how comedy might show us the way towards greater freedom and emancipation. Here is where her book really shines. In a meticulous, close reading of Dream, MacDonald parses the various relationships that constitute the play's tension, showing that their resolution indicates both the greater incorporation of the particular but also a more mature attitude towards the universal. When the play begins, Hermia is defying her father's orders to marry Demetrius; she wants to marry Lysander. The Athenian Duke, Theseus, is unsympathetic to the lovers' plight even as he attempts to woo his own captured and reluctant bride, Hippolyta. Thanks to a night lost in a forest outside of Athens, a fairy king, and various love potions, things work out: but not before each of the characters undergoes a transformation (one of them, famously, into an ass and back). I cannot do justice to MacDonald's lively analysis of the play here, but it is nuanced, surprising, and even captivating. Especially engaging is her analysis of Dream's play within a play, in which Quince, the play's somewhat buffoonish director, "provides us with a model of how one might govern" (117). Unlike his social betters, Quince "does not refuse the advice of his actors but listens to it, and, when it appears 'reasonable,' uses it" -- and when not, not. Even in Quince's decision to have both the moon and the wall played by humans, MacDonald finds relevance: "Shakespeare thus comically portrays the meeting of objective truth with our particular and subjective existences, even if Quince may not fully comprehend the true poet's pen strokes" (119).

It is, MacDonald implies, no coincidence that Dream also depicts women who assert their particular desires against more powerful men. But, unlike Antigone, the women in Shakespeare's play compromise and convince their male counterparts to do the same. Dream's women do not abandon their desires, and, in most cases, their desires are fulfilled. But neither do they act as if the universal, the state, were of no importance. Ultimately, MacDonald argues, "the movement from tragedy to comedy requires both the extension of the objective world to include individual subjectivity and enlarged subjective preferences that recognize and accept the rational interest of the objective realm" (132). Such movement also has practical consequences for the success of the state: "Citizens, finding their freedoms protected by the state, are more willing, when necessary, to relinquish their subjective desires for the good of the whole." "Consequently," she concludes, "possible tragedies might become comedies" (138). In depicting such a world, MacDonald suggests, Shakespeare more than earns Hegel's praise.

MacDonald has done Hegel scholarship a substantial service in this book. As an extension of Hegel's argument, MacDonald's use of Dream is refreshing and compelling: it opens up new, concrete and creative avenues for understanding Hegel. She has breathed new life into old arguments and indicated again the importance of Hegel's comments on aesthetics for his political theory. Perhaps most importantly, she has vindicated the practice of taking Hegel's literary references seriously. In highlighting the potential of a Hegelian analysis of one of Shakespeare's comedies, MacDonald's book perhaps intensifies our disappointment that Hegel never expanded on his truncated praise of Shakespeare. But it is also difficult to imagine him improving on MacDonald's skillful exegesis.


Hegel, G.W.F. Aesthetics: Lectures on Fine Art. Trans. T. M. Knox. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1975.

---. Elements of the Philosophy of Right. Trans. H.S. Nisbet. Ed. Allen W. Wood. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.

---. The Philosophy of History. Trans. J. Sibree. Amherst, N.Y.: Prometheus Books, 1991.

---. Philosophy of Mind. Trans. A.V. Miller. Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1971.

[1] Allen Speight's Hegel, Literature, and the Problem of Agency (Cambridge, 2000) is an example MacDonald makes some (but not, I think, enough) use of; Patchen Markell's Bound by Recognition (Princeton, 2003) and Michelle Gellrich's Tragedy and Theory: The Problem of Conflict since Aristotle (Princeton, 1988) are two she does not mention but that are certainly relevant.

[2] MacDonald accepts too readily the idea that the state as depicted in the Philosophy of Right is the Prussian state as Hegel knew it. Scholarship of the last decades has definitively shown this not to be the case.