Finding Meaning in an Imperfect World

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Iddo Landau, Finding Meaning in an Imperfect World, Oxford University Press, 297pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190657666.

Reviewed by Stephen M. Campbell, Bentley University, and Sven Nyholm, Eindhoven University of Technology





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A noteworthy feature of much ancient philosophy -- especially during the Hellenistic period -- is that it viewed philosophical reasoning as a practical tool with a real potential for helping human beings to lead better lives. For example, Epicurus presented ideas and arguments to help us deal with the fear of death and other threats to happiness, while Stoics like Epictetus and Seneca gave us strategies to overcome frustration and anger. Contemporary philosophers have almost entirely abandoned that way of thinking about their craft. They mostly write for other philosophically-trained academics and have relinquished the role of offering practical life-guidance to religious thinkers, positive psychologists, "self-help" authors, and various others.

Iddo Landau's delightful new book is a rare and refreshing exception to the rule. Not unlike ancient philosophers with their philosophical cures, Landau seeks to rid us of the disturbing belief that our lives are meaningless or insufficiently meaningful. The central aim of his book is to challenge various presuppositions and arguments that lead people to think their lives aren't meaningful, and to offer practical guidance on how to recognize and increase the meaningful aspects of one's life (3). While most of the recent philosophical work on meaning in life is very theoretical, Landau's book is engaging, accessible, and pitched toward those who have genuine concerns about the value or worth of their lives.

The book opens with the story of its origin. Years ago, in one of Landau's introductory philosophy classes, a student interjected that there was no point in discussing the topic under consideration (causal necessity) since "life is completely meaningless." Landau describes the discussion that ensued: some reflective questions posed to the student led her to rethink her initial view. It was this encounter that sparked the idea that "many people may find rational, philosophical discussions of the meaning of life quite helpful" (1-2). Landau's resulting book offers us 279 pages of philosophical discussion of how we can find meaning in an imperfect world.

In the opening chapter, Landau clarifies what he means by the phrase "the meaning of life." There are two senses of "meaning" -- an interpretive-explanatory sense ("What is the meaning of that piece of art?") and an evaluative sense ("That piece of art means a lot to me"). Landau devotes several pages to arguing that concern with the meaning of our lives is typically a matter of the value or worth of our lives, rather than a matter of understanding or intelligibility. Even when a sense of disorientation or lack of intelligibility about one's life leads to a sense of meaninglessness, Landau thinks it does so via a perceived loss of worth (6-16). He also clarifies that his focus is the meaning of individual human lives, as opposed to human or biological life generally (6). By the end of the discussion, Landau arrives at his working understanding of meaning: "A meaningful life is one in which there is a sufficient number of aspects of sufficient value, and a meaningless life is one in which there is not a sufficient number of aspects of sufficient value." (15-16)

In chapter 2, Landau highlights a number of important implications of the relationship between value and meaning: determining the meaning of one's life doesn't admit of the sort of precision found in the sciences; meaning is a matter of degree; meaning (or lack thereof) can change over time; having meaning doesn't solve all of our problems; some aspect of a life can be meaningful even if we don't want to devote all of our time to it.

The bulk of Landau's book (chapters 3-13) is a systematic examination of the following considerations that have led some to think that most human lives are meaningless:

Most of us fail to attain perfection or make rare and difficult achievements. ("The perfectionist presupposition," ch. 3-4)

We will eventually cease to exist. (ch. 5-6)

Whatever we humans do is negligible when viewed from the perspective of the wider universe. (ch. 7)

We lack free will, and too much of our selves and lives are shaped by blind chance. (ch. 8)

Nothing can be known with certainty. (ch. 9)

Nothing is objectively true or valuable. (ch. 9)

We have no ultimate end or purpose. (ch. 10)

Getting the things we desire often leaves us without a sense of meaning. ("The paradox of the end," ch. 11)

Life is full of suffering. (ch. 12)

There is an abundance of evil in the world. (ch. 13)

In discussing many of these claims, Landau employs a two-pronged strategy. He first casts doubt on whether the claim in question is true; he then argues that, even if it is true, the claim is compatible with our lives being meaningful. In each case, Landau ultimately concludes that the highlighted imperfection of our world need not undermine the meaning of our lives. Underlying all of Landau's discussion is a powerful and very straightforward argument. To have meaning in our lives is to have a life with a sufficient amount of value. And even if our lives are imperfect in many ways, they still typically contain a sufficient number of aspects of sufficient value. Hence, for most of us, it is possible to live a meaningful life in an imperfect world.

After an interlude with various possible explanations as to why people undervalue the meaning of their lives (ch. 14), Landau reaches the most practical part of the book. His focus here is on two distinct strategies for increasing the meaning in one's life -- "identifying" and "recognizing." Identifying (the subject of ch. 15-16) is the process by which a person discovers what is or would be meaningful for her. As Landau observes, "Many dedicate more thought in one evening to deliberating which restaurant or film they should go to than they do in their entire lifetime to deliberating what would make their lives more meaningful" (205). His two chapters on identifying are a wonderful resource for entering into that deliberation. Landau presents a very useful list of questions to assist his readers in this undertaking, considers various concrete strategies for increasing meaning, and discusses the impulse to radically overhaul one's life (and why that approach should be approached with caution).

Recognizing, in turn, is a matter of coming to emotionally appreciate the meaning in one's life. It is possible to identify sources of meaning in one's life without fully "sensing" or "feeling" their meaningfulness. Recognizing meaning means "overcoming this numbness to value" (230), and Landau offers several suggestions for how one might achieve this. For instance, one can sensitize oneself not only to valuable aspects in one's life at the present time, but also to valuable aspect in one's past. Landau tells how a relative, at the funeral of her son who tragically passed away at the age of thirty-six, expressed gratitude for the time she had together with her son. This was a way for her not only to acknowledge (at an intellectual level) that her time together with her son was meaningful, but also to fully recognize and feel its meaning at an emotional level. This potential for recognizing the meaningfulness of things past is a reason to resist the idea that one should always try to live in the present (238-39). In another part, Landau discusses how we tend to have aesthetic experiences in museums because "we adopt an aesthetic attitude when we enter them." He notes that "We can take that museum attitude out into the world with us" and develop our sensitivity to beauty and other kinds of value in our lives more generally (242-43). For Landau, the importance of recognizing meaning is not merely a matter of appreciating the meaning that we have. He contends that the act of recognizing increases the meaning in our lives. This is because sensing the meaning in one's life is in itself a good thing, and because it is conducive to being happier and avoiding the pitfalls of felt meaninglessness (232).

The contents of Landau's book are too rich and varied for us to have attempted a comprehensive summarization here, but we would like to mention a few other excellent and noteworthy parts of the book. They include Landau's discussion of competitive vs. noncompetitive value (3.7); the analysis of the Sisyphus myth as a metaphor for our lives (ch. 5-6) and Landau's own competing metaphor (6.2); his responses to Nagel, Epicurus, and Lucretius on death's alleged threat to meaning (ch. 5); his discussion about the overly negative focus of newspapers and history books (13.1); his case that meaning is possible in the absence of religion, even if religion often provides an excellent vehicle for meaning (18.3); and Landau's critical discussion of existentialist themes (18.5).

We will now make a few critical observations about Landau's treatment of the meaning of life.

First, Landau's proposed account of the meaning of life is rather thin and vague, at least by philosophical standards. This is probably by design; Landau seems eager for his book to be of interest and use to a broader audience. We assume that he offers a sketch rather than a fully developed account of meaning, so as not to bore all but the philosophers with an intricate account of necessary and sufficient conditions, test cases, objections and replies, etc. Still, it seems worthwhile, in this venue, to note a few limitations of this sketch.

Landau's proposal is that meaning is a matter of having value in one's life, but this idea raises many questions. Arguably, some valuable things can be located in one's life without endowing the life with any meaning. If your sibling's work earns her a Nobel Peace Prize, this seems to bring things of great value into your life (it is your sibling, after all). But if you made no real contribution to support that work, it doesn't seem to be the sort of thing that serves to make your life more meaningful. Relatedly, it seems intuitively true that certain ways in which value is connected to an individual's life generate more meaning than others. All else being equal, it would seem more meaningful when a person intentionally brings about some valuable outcome than when she does so accidentally, and more meaningful if it is a central part of her life than if it is at the periphery. These observations suggest that Landau's account needs more specification about the ways in which value can be located in a life and how this impacts meaning.

Second, there are some implications of Landau's account that conflict with widely held intuitions about meaning. Take, for example, his treatment of meaningfulness and pleasure. According to Landau, "avoiding or decreasing their own suffering and increasing their own pleasure" imparts meaning on the lives of many people (218). This follows from his value-based account of the meaningful life and the plausible claim that pleasure and happiness (including one's own) are valuable things. But doesn't this imply that, in principle, the pleasurable life of a harmless but narcissistic playboy could prove a very meaningful life? Most people would say that that is not a meaningful life, even if it is a life in which one fares well in a certain narrow respect. Landau also seems to be critical of the possibility that the playboy's life is meaningful, noting that pleasure "is usually insufficient by itself and should not come at the expense of all other worthy dimensions of life" (219). Yet, it is not clear that his account can really rule out the possibility of the narcissistic hedonist living a meaningful life.

One way to avoid the implication that the hedonistic playboy's life is meaningful would be to insist that only certain kinds of activities or values contribute to making people's lives meaningful. For instance, people sometimes associate meaning with participation in projects, activities, or causes that are both valuable and greater than ourselves. This might help to explain why the harmless playboy's life is not particularly meaningful.

Third, if we understand meaning to be a matter of having value within our lives, it would seem that we should not only distinguish between meaningful aspects of our lives (that is, aspects with positive value) and meaningless aspects of our lives (aspects that lack positive value), as Landau does. We should also acknowledge the possibility of aspects of our lives that are the polar opposite of meaningful. What we might call "anti-meaningful" aspects of our lives are those that have disvalue or negative value. This dimension seems to fit very naturally with Landau's general definition of meaningfulness according to which a part of one's life is meaningful if it is valuable. If value in our lives constitutes meaning, why shouldn't we think that disvalue in our lives constitutes anti-meaning? This topic is very pertinent to Landau's project since anti-meaning (if it is a real phenomenon) constitutes a threat to our ability to lead meaningful lives.[1]

In addition to these critical points, there is another issue that deserves mention. Just as reading the work of Arthur Schopenhauer gives one the strong sense of being exposed to a pessimist's view of the world, it is difficult to read Landau's book without getting the opposite impression -- namely, that this book is clearly the product of an optimistic individual. While we found it refreshing to read an extended philosophical treatment of meaning in life that reflects a positive outlook on life, this consideration of temperament did raise certain questions to our minds. To what extent do our views about the meaningfulness of life ultimately depend on whether our temperaments are basically pessimistic or optimistic? Could a more pessimistic person like Schopenhauer pick up Landau's book and be convinced of his ultimate conclusion? Or does one need to share Landau's optimistic outlook in order to find his arguments convincing? We do not know the answer to this.

Even if pessimists do find Landau's ultimate conclusion unconvincing, anyone should be able to recognize great value in Landau's discussion. His book is a fruitful source of ideas for how we can live meaningful lives in the imperfect world we find ourselves in.

This book would work very well in undergraduate courses dealing with meaning in life or well-being. That the book's working account of the meaningful life leaves room for further specification could function as a basis for productive and fun uses in the classroom. For example, students could work out ways of making Landau's view more concrete, so as to make it fit with their intuitive judgments about what sorts of valuable activities do the most to make life meaningful. Many of the chapters (e.g. 5-8, 12-13) could be easily incorporated into a topical introductory philosophy course and would work particularly well if paired with papers or excerpts from the various authors whose views are discussed, such as Schopenhauer, Camus, Nagel, and Epicurus. We expect that many students would appreciate and be impacted by Landau's chapters on identifying and recognizing meaning in life.

Philosophers working on meaning might desire more precision, but there are many things that researchers can take away from Landau's discussion and build upon in their own work. For example, we see a potential for using Landau's general discussion as a source of ideas in on-going discussions within the philosophy of technology about whether robotics and other forms of automation are threats to the meaningfulness of human life.

On the whole, Iddo Landau's book is a wonderful contribution. It is a delightful read and should prove a helpful resource for teachers and for researchers who work on the meaning of life. And, perhaps most importantly, this book offers people hope and guidance for living a meaningful life in our all too imperfect world.

[1] For a more detailed introduction to the concept of anti-meaning, see Thaddeus Metz’s Meaning in Life (Oxford University Press, 2013), 63-64, 233-36 (Metz calls it “antimatter”) and our essay “Anti-Meaning and Why It Matters” Journal of the American Philosophical Association 1 (2015): 694-711.