First, Second, and Other Selves: Essays on Friendship and Personal Identity

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Jennifer Whiting, First, Second, and Other Selves: Essays on Friendship and Personal Identity, Oxford University Press, 2016, 261pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199967919.

Reviewed by David O. Brink, University of California, San Diego


This is the first of three volumes of Jennifer Whiting's collected papers and focuses on issues about personal identity and friendship. The volume's eight essays are all previously published, but in disparate venues, so the volume allows the reader to see the cumulative force of ideas developed piecemeal and recurrent themes. Whiting herself identifies three such themes. First, she focuses on psychic contingency and variability, which is sometimes a symptom of pathology but often a reminder that familiar assumptions of moral psychology are neither universal nor necessary. Second, she explores Aristotle's conception of the friend as another self and its significance for our understanding of intrapersonal and interpersonal relations and concern. Her third theme emerges from the second and involves a non-egocentric perspective on self-love and love of others. She treats the interpersonal case as prior in explanation and justification to the intrapersonal case.

Her outside-in strategy contrasts with the inside-out strategy that goes with an egocentric assimilation of the interpersonal case to the intrapersonal case. This leads her to defend an ethocentric, or character-based, conception of both prudential concern and friendship. There are important kinds of historical influence and inspiration in these essays, including Whiting's exploration of Aristotle's conception of friendship, her discussion of Platonic love, and her discussion of Plato's conception of the soul in the Republic. However, most of the essays concentrate on systematic, rather than historical, issues and debates. Apparently, the other two volumes of essays will be more historical, focusing on the metaphysical and psychological basis of Aristotle's ethics.

These essays are long and densely argued, defying easy summary. But they are extremely rewarding and repay careful study. They display philosophical imagination and give expression to an independent voice. Whiting's essays are also deeply personal, reflecting ongoing conversations with her philosophical mentors, colleagues, and friends. Whiting is engaged in dialogue with Plato, Aristotle, Locke, Sydney Shoemaker, Derek Parfit, Annette Baier, and Terence Irwin, among others, and one comes away with a strong sense of her as a philosophical interlocutor. Her essays on personal identity and friendship are among the most important work on these topics in the last three decades. Her defense of a broadly psychological reductionist conception of personal identity is a worthy successor to the contributions of Shoemaker and Parfit, and her ethocentric conception of friendship and self-love is an important and original contribution to the literature on love and friendship. Anyone interested in these philosophical topics will profit from reading these essays together.

In what follows, I summarize the contributions of individual essays and then turn to raising some questions about her claims about personal identity and friendship.

In traditional debates about the nature of personal identity, Locke, Bishop Butler, and Thomas Reid agree that personal identity is a forensic concept, tied to backward-looking normative concerns about responsibility and desert and forward-looking ones involving the special concern one has for one's own future that is different from the sort of concern one has for others to whom one stands in no special relationship. In "Friends and Future Selves" Whiting explores the worry that Butler and Reid raise that Lockean conceptions of personal identity cannot explain and justify special concern, because they recognize identity in only a "loose and popular," not a "strict and philosophical," sense.

Though she raises questions about whether personal identity is sufficient for special concern, her main claim is that it is not necessary. Interpersonal relationships, such as friendship, also display a form of special concern that does not presuppose personal identity. In fact, friendship allows us to stand the normal assumption that special concern requires personal identity on its head -- it's not just that special concern does not presuppose personal identity but rather that personal identity presupposes special concern. Just as special concern for one's friend is part of what makes that person a friend, so too special concern for oneself is part of what establishes psychological continuity within one's own life. Presumably, special concern involves not only positive affective regard for its target but also a suite of behavioral dispositions to make various investments and sacrifices for the sake of that person. Whiting's claim is that special concern is not the product of personal identity so much as an essential constituent of it.

Friendship is the focus of "Impersonal Friends," where Whiting examines Aristotle's claim that the friend is "another oneself" (Nicomachean Ethics 1161b 19, 28-35, 1169b4-6; Magna Moralia 1213a2-23) and defends her ethocentric interpretation that the ground of the best sort of friendship is the friend's virtuous character. She defends this kind of impersonal friendship for another's virtue against Gregory Vlastos's objections and against an egocentric interpretation defended by Irwin and myself, according to which friendship makes the beloved's interests an extension of the agent's own interests.[1] Both the egocentric and ethocentric interpretations agree that friends stand to each other in psychological relations much as a person stands psychologically to his own future self and that friends should care for each other as they care for themselves. But whereas the egocentric interpretation reads these claims from the inside-out -- extending claims from the intrapersonal case to the interpersonal one -- Whiting's ethocentric interpretation reads these claims from the outside-in -- drawing lessons for the intrapersonal case from the interpersonal one. She thinks that the outside-in strategy is to be preferred, in part because she thinks the egocentric approach supports a "colonial" attitude toward friends.[2]

In "Trusting First and Second Selves", Whiting examines Baier's claims about the importance of trust among friends. She subjects Baier's claims to friendly amendment in which she argues that a certain amount of distrust or at least a willingness to distrust is a mark of healthy relationships to friends and to oneself. She leverages Virginia Woolf's concerns in Three Guineas to raise questions about whether we ought to trust ourselves fully. Presumably, these forms of distrust are also justified in response to blindspots and implicit bias. We can't imagine theoretical or practical reasoning without some substantial degree of trust in our earlier selves, but that trust needs to be balanced with a healthy dose of fallibilism. Presumably, these reasons to adopt a fallibilist attitude toward ourselves apply to friends and others. Common projects won't succeed without considerable trust, but that trust should be leavened with a willingness to question the assumptions and commitments of our friends.

In "Back to 'The Self and the Future'" Whiting revisits a debate between Shoemaker and Bernard Williams over the possibility of "body swaps" of the sort discussed by Shoemaker in the famous Brownson case, in which Brown's brain is transplanted into Robinson's body.[3] To separate psychological continuity and sameness of brain, we might modify the Brownson case so that Brownson is psychologically continuous with Brown without having Brown's brain. We could do this by scanning Brown's brain states and then reconfiguring Robinson's brain so as to realize Brown's psychology. Brownson would then be psychologically, but in no way physically, continuous with Brown. Even Williams initially agrees with Shoemaker that Brownson seems to be Brown, because he inherits Brown's mental life. But Williams thinks that our intuitions here are unstable. If we re-describe such a case in terms of psychological changes that will be induced in you prior to the person in your body being tortured, Williams claims, we will find that we still experience special concern for the psychologically discontinuous person who will be tortured, revealing that our criteria of identity are physical or bodily.

Whiting does a nice job of reconstructing the dialectic and pointing out ways in which Williams begs the question against Shoemaker and psychological continuity. Moreover, she invokes her comparison of friends and future selves to motivate the idea, which Williams must deny, that personal identity can be indeterminate. Interpersonal associations come in degrees, with the result that some associations are clearly friendships, some are clearly not, and some have an indeterminate status. If intrapersonal relations are relevantly like friendship, we should be receptive to the idea that some forms of psychological continuity are sufficient for personal identity, some are insufficient, and some have an indeterminate status.

"Personal Identity: The Non-Branching Form of What Matters" is an excellent exposition and defense of a broadly psychological reductionist claim that personal identity consists in non-branching psychological continuity. Whiting usefully distinguishes two strands in this tradition -- a reductionist strand, which she associates with Parfit, and a non-reductionist strand, which she associates with Shoemaker and defends. This distinction might also be understood as a contrast between two different kinds of reductionism with different objects. Shoemaker and Parfit both accept psychological reductionism about personal identity insofar as they both think that persons P1 and P2 are identical insofar as the later one is related to the earlier one by non-branching psychological continuity.[4] Notice that the definiens of reductionism about personal identity invokes the concept of a person. Parfit and Shoemaker part company over whether to accept reductionism about persons, with Parfit embracing reductionism about persons and Shoemaker denying it. Parfit thinks that persons can be reduced to (or perhaps eliminated in favor of) mental happenings that need not be ascribed to a person or thinker (Reasons and Persons ยง81), whereas Shoemaker thinks that mental states should be understood functionally as states of a system -- a person -- with characteristic inputs, outputs, and relations to other internal states of the system. Whiting plausibly suggests that the debate between Shoemaker and Parfit can be traced to two different strands in Locke's views about personal identity. Parfit's reductionism about persons fits best with the passive dimensions of Locke's focus on experiential memory, whereas Shoemaker's non-reductionism about persons fits best with Locke's emphasis on the forensic role of persons and the connection between persons and agency.

"One is Not Born but Becomes a Person: The Importance of Philosophical Mothering" engages some of Baier's reflections about the limitations in traditional rationalist conceptions of persons as anti-naturalistic, individualistic, and intellectualist. Whiting wants to endorse many aspects of Baier's naturalism about persons and her emphasis on the way in which normative maturation is dependent on proper nurture from another. But she wants to embrace these claims while rejecting Baier's critique of the method of cases and thought experiments prevalent in the literature on personal identity.

"Love: Self-Propagation, Self-Preservation, or Ekstasis?" looks at the analysis of interpersonal love in Plato's Symposium and Phaedrus, comparing three different kinds of readings -- Irwin's egocentric conception, Harry Frankfurt's identificationist conception, and her own ecstatic conception, in which the lover literally transcends himself. Whiting thinks the ecstatic conception is necessary to explain the claims the beloved makes on the lover and the reciprocity that one finds in the best sort of love.

"Psychic Contingency in the Republic" is a discussion of Plato's claims about the human soul in the Republic. Whiting contrasts a realist reading that takes seriously Plato's talk of parts of the soul and identifies the person with the rational part of her soul with a deflationist reading that understands parts of the soul to be simply different aspects of an agent. This debate seems bound up with how many parts of the soul Plato recognizes and which parts these are. Some commentators think that Book IV's understanding of akrasia requires a deflationist conception of the parts of the soul so that we can understand the agent acting against her own better judgment, but they also think that the discussion of deviant constitutions and souls in Books VIII-IX requires taking seriously the idea that different parts of an agent's soul act as independent agents. Both realists and deflationists tend to assume that we need a consistent reading of the soul and its parts throughout the Republic and that Plato accepts a tripartite division of the soul throughout.

Whiting questions these assumptions. She argues that when Plato talks about the relations among the parts of the soul in virtuous and non-virtuous people the number and identity of the relata and the nature of the relation can vary. In the virtuous person, there is a reason-responsive harmony between reason, emotion, and the appetites, so that it is misplaced to think of faction and rule of one part by others. By contrast, in non-virtuous persons there is psychic conflict, and the number and identity of the factions will depend on the ways in which the individual is reasons-responsive or not. This leads Whiting to defend a hybrid reading of Books II-IV and VII-IX in which deflationists are roughly right in their treatment of the appetites in II-IV and the realists are roughly right about the parts of corrupt souls in VIII-IX. Her case for contingency and variability in Plato's moral psychology in the Republic is exceptionally rich and interesting and repays careful reading.

Any reader should find these essays rewarding and stimulating. Different readers will be drawn to different themes and will assess Whiting's claims differently. I'll close by raising some questions about Whiting's contrast between egocentric and ethocentric conceptions of intrapersonal and interpersonal unity, and her defense of the ethocentric conception.

Both intrapersonal and interpersonal unity are matters of psychological continuity, and what separates intrapersonal and garden-variety interpersonal cases is a matter of degree, not kind. The egocentric conception adopts an inside-out approach, claiming that interpersonal psychological continuity extends the person's interests, even when it does not extend her life. Fission in which Tom's psychology is transferred to two persons -- Dick and Harry -- is the limiting form of interpersonal psychological continuity, because the degree of continuity is, by hypothesis, maximal. Here, Tom does not literally survive fission, because identity is a one-one relation and psychological continuity is a one-many relation, but nonetheless we can see Tom's interests preserved in the lives of Dick and Harry. Tom has posthumous interests in the lives of Dick and Harry. Of course, fission is a thought experiment. But there are real forms of interpersonal psychological continuity all around us, notably in relationships between friends and loved ones who share experiences and discussion with each other, influence each other psychologically, and care about each other. We often talk about the interests of the beloved as part of the interests of the lover, and the egocentric conception asks us to take this seriously.

By contrast, the ethocentric conception adopts an outside-in approach, claiming that self-love should be understood on the model of love of another. In particular, the ethocentric conception claims that the basis of interpersonal love is love of the character -- in particular, the virtuous character or perhaps the capacity for virtuous character -- of another. This is a kind of impersonal love. When we extend this conception to the intrapersonal case, we see that even love of one's future self is not egocentric but is or should be an impersonal love of the virtuous character of one's future self. Rather than loving another as myself, I should love myself as I love another.

As we have seen, Whiting defends her ethocentric conception both as an interpretation of Aristotle's conception of friendship and as a systematic proposal in part because she thinks that the egocentric approach imparts an objectionably colonial attitude toward interpersonal love and friendship. I am skeptical of both claims. I think that Aristotle's eudaimonism commits him to the egocentric conception, that his claims about the friend as another self conform to the inside-out approach (EN 1170b6-9), and that treating the good of another as a complete, but not unconditionally complete, good can avoid taking a colonial attitude toward others.[5] I have argued for these claims elsewhere but don't want to re-litigate them here. Instead, I want to raise a concern about Whiting's ethocentric conception and mention an alternative to both egocentric and ethocentric conceptions that she might find congenial.

The basis of ethocentric concern for another is the other's valuable traits. This explains one's reasons for becoming friends with another on account of the other's traits. But it seems more problematic as the ground for concern for another who is already one's friend. If my reason for caring for my friend consists in her virtuous or valuable traits, then it seems that I care about her virtue, rather than herself. The ethocentric conception has difficulty explaining why I should care more about my friend than other virtuous people with whom I am not friends or why I shouldn't be willing to "trade up" from my virtuous friend to a still more virtuous stranger. Whiting does offer pragmatic reasons for privileging one's virtuous friends over virtuous strangers -- epistemic and causal factors allow one to better promote virtue with those one already knows and associates with (p. 61). But like Henry Sidgwick's similar pragmatic utilitarian justification of special concern and special obligations and John Perry's impersonal justification of personal projects, these pragmatic rationales for special concern may seem insufficient to underwrite robust special concern for oneself and one's friends.[6]

We can avoid these worries about ethocentric special concern by claiming that it is the shared history with the individual who is a friend that grounds an agent-relative form of special concern for her that one doesn't have for a stranger, however virtuous. One form of agent-relative concern is egocentric. But we can make sense of agent-relative concern that is not egoistic. Let us stipulate that prudence and egocentric concern presuppose personal identity, inasmuch as both assume that reasons are grounded in self-interest. Fission teaches us that we can have agent-relative special concern in the absence of personal identity, provided there is psychological continuity. But then we can formulate agent-relative concern that presupposes continuity, rather than identity. Taking a page from the Lockean reply to Butler's circularity worry, we might call this special concern quasi-prudence and treat it as a quasi-egocentric conception. Once we see that there is interpersonal psychological continuity to be found outside of fission cases in more familiar forms of association, we can see how we might defend a quasi-egocentric conception of friendship. This quasi-egocentric conception would be different from the egocentric conception in not viewing the friend through the lens of self-interest, but it would also be different from the ethocentric conception in assigning intrinsic, and not just pragmatic, significance to the shared history between friends.

We might compare the quasi-egocentric conception of special concern with C.D. Broad's doctrine of self-referential altruism in his unjustly neglected essay "Self and Others."[7] Broad was reacting to the reductionist tendencies in Sidgwick's two methods of ethics -- egoism and utilitarianism. Broad thought that egoism cannot do justice to our duties to others and that utilitarianism cannot do justice to our special obligations. So, he introduced an agent-relative alternative between these extremes that he thought better reflected ordinary views about special concern for others. Self-referential altruism recognizes non-derivative reason to benefit others but it says that

each of us has specially urgent obligations to benefit certain individuals and groups which stand in certain special relations to himself, e.g. his parents, his children, his fellow-countrymen, etc. And it holds that these special relationships are the ultimate and sufficient ground for those specially urgent claims on one's beneficence. ("Self and Others," 279-80).

Self-referential altruism is a hybrid of two non-derivative elements: an agent-neutral concern for anyone it is in one's power to affect for better or worse and an agent-relative special concern for those to whom one stands in special relationships. The quasi-egocentric conception stands to egocentric and ethocentric rivals much as self-referential altruism stands to egoism and utilitarianism. Because it is a hybrid of inside-out and outside-in elements, a quasi-egocentric conception may have virtues that its purebred rivals don't. Perhaps the take-home message from "Friends and Future Selves" should be a hybrid conception, rather than the ethocentric conception we find in "Impersonal Friends."

[1] See Gregory Vlastos, "The Individual as Object of Love in Plato" in Platonic Studies (Princeton University Press, 1981) and Terence Irwin, Aristotle's First Principles (Clarendon Press, 1988), ch. 18. I have defended the egocentric interpretation in "Rational Egoism, Self, and Others" in Identity, Character, and Morality, ed. O. Flanagan and A. Rorty (MIT Press, 1990); "Self-love and Altruism" Social Philosophy & Policy Social Philosophy & Policy 14 (1997): 122-57; "Eudaimonism, Love and Friendship, and Political Community" Social Philosophy & Policy 16 (1999): 252-89; and "Eudaimonism and Cosmopolitan Concern" in Virtue, Happiness, and Knowledge: Themes from the Work of Gail Fine and Terence Irwin, ed. D. Brink, S. Meyer, and C. Shields (Clarendon Press, forthcoming).

[2] I find it puzzling that Whiting thinks that I badly misread her "Friends and Future Selves" (1986) in my "Rational Egoism, Self, and Others" (1990) as presupposing a form of rational egoism (pp. 9, 198). I explicitly acknowledge that we come to the intrapersonal/interpersonal comparison from different perspectives: "On the surface, her position is just the reverse of mine; she wants to model the justification of self-concern on concern for one's friends, whereas I want to model the justification of concern for one's friends (and others more generally) on self-concern. I'm less clear that our different routes to this comparison between self-concern and concern for one's friends require us to disagree on the substance of the comparison." ("Rational Egoism, Self, and Others," 373). So not only do I not presuppose that she is a rational egoist, I deny it, but nonetheless wonder if we could agree on the substance of the comparison. To put it in terms of the metaphors introduced here, I acknowledge that while my approach is inside-out and hers is outside-in, I wonder if we could nonetheless meet somewhere in the middle.

[3] See Sydney Shoemaker, Self-knowledge and Self-Identity (Cornell University Press, 1963), esp. pp. 22-25 and Bernard Williams, "The Self and the Future" reprinted in Bernard Williams, Problems of the Self (Cambridge University Press, 1973).

[4] Derek Parfit, Reasons and Persons (Clarendon Press, 1984), Part III and Sydney Shoemaker, "Personal Identity: A Materialist's Account" in S. Shoemaker and R. Swinburne, Personal Identity (Blackwell, 1984).

[5] See my essays mentioned in note 1. However, as Whiting points out (p. 10), Magna Moralia 1212b18-20 can be read so as to support the outside-in reading.

[6] Henry Sidgwick, The Methods of Ethics, 7th ed. (Macmillan, 1907), esp. pp. 431-39 and John Perry, "The Importance of Being Identical" in The Identities of Persons, ed. A. Rorty (University of California Press, 1976). Interestingly, Whiting's pragmatic rationale for special concern in "Impersonal Friends" seems in tension with her criticism of Perry's pragmatic rationale for personal projects in "Friends and Future Selves" (pp. 35-38).

[7] C.D. Broad, "Self and Others" in Broad's Critical Essays in Moral Philosophy, ed. D. Cheney (George Allen and Unwin, 1971).