Fitting Things Together: Coherence and the Demands of Structural Rationality

Fitting Things Together

Alex Worsnip, Fitting Things Together: Coherence and the Demands of Structural Rationality, Oxford University Press, 2021, 360pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197608142.

Reviewed by Jonathan Way, University of Southampton


Philosophers often distinguish—if not always in these terms—between substantive rationality and structural rationality. You are substantively rational when you respond correctly to normative reasons—for instance, when you believe what your evidence supports, or make sensible decisions. You are structurally rational, or coherent, when your attitudes ‘fit together right’—for instance, when your beliefs are consistent, and you intend what you take to be the necessary means to your ends. There is a long tradition of seeing structural rationality as having a kind of bedrock, or especially secure, status. For example, while we can intelligibly question the demands of morality, we cannot, it has been thought, raise the same questions about the demands of coherence. One of the most striking developments of normative philosophy over the past twenty five years has been a general pushback against this line of thought. We can intelligibly ask why coherence matters (or as it is often put, whether structural rationality is normative), and the answer is elusive (Broome 2005; Kolodny 2005). Partly because of this, some now take the tradition to have got things backwards. Rationality is fundamentally about responding correctly to reasons; coherence matters only to the extent that it is a byproduct of this (Kolodny 2007; Kiesewetter 2017; Lord 2018).

In this book, Alex Worsnip defends the importance of structural rationality against this recent trend. For Worsnip, structural rationality is genuine—a real, ineliminable form of rationality; autonomous—irreducible to substantive rationality; unified—instances of (in)coherence share something in common; and normatively significant—facts about structural rationality constitute normative reasons to deliberate in ways that lead to coherence (ix). But Worsnip’s view is not a defence of the tradition either. For Worsnip, substantive rationality is also genuine and irreducible. The traditional worries about the demands of morality are an example—one among many—of the confusions that can result from failing to distinguish the two forms of rationality.

This is an excellent book. The first part, which spells out and defends Worsnip’s autonomy thesis, provides a lucid explication of the two forms of rationality, and a searching examination of attempts to reduce or eliminate one or the other. The second, more constructive, part develops an original theory of structural rationality, centrally including accounts of the unity and normativity of structural rationality. There’s much of interest here; I’ll say more about it below. The shorter third part of the book (one chapter and a brief coda) applies the results of the book to wider issues. Worsnip argues that a host of substantive debates—especially in epistemology (including formal epistemology), but also in metaethics and in the social sciences—can benefit from taking seriously the distinction between structural and substantive rationality. This is an impressive chapter, covering a lot of ground but consistently illuminating.

Worsnip’s theory of structural rationality, as developed in part two of the book, has three main elements. First, Worsnip offers an account of what unifies cases of (in)coherence. Second, Worsnip defends the view that there are requirements of structural rationality (in the sense of norms or principles, not just necessary conditions). These requirements are ‘wide-scope in spirit’, in that they characteristically prohibit combinations of attitudes (e.g., believing p and believing not-p), rather than individual attitudes.[1] Third, Worsnip argues that these requirements are normative—they constitute reasons to deliberate in ways that lead to coherence. I will describe the first and third of these, and raise some questions. In passing, let me also recommend Worsnip’s chapter on talk about structural rationality. It makes a compelling case that the ‘wide-scope in spirit’ view is, contrary to what is sometimes thought, entirely compatible with the orthodox Kratzerian semantics for deontic modals.

Worsnip’s account of what unifies cases of (in)coherence begins from an observation that is sometimes made, but rarely made much of. There is something puzzling, or hard to make sense of, about incoherence. We struggle to maintain incoherent attitudes and hesitate to attribute incoherence to others. To be more precise, it is difficult to conceive of someone maintaining incoherent attitudes under what Worsnip calls conditions of ‘full transparency’—roughly, once they are consciously aware of the relevant attitudes simultaneously. Building on this observation, Worsnip proposes that a set of attitudes is incoherent just if it is constitutive of these attitudes that anyone holding them is disposed to revise at least one of them, under conditions of full transparency (133).

This is an intriguing and attractive answer to an important but neglected question. As Worsnip argues, it seems to get many core cases right. I expect it will generate plenty of discussion about whether it correctly classifies all cases (for a start, see Daoust forthcoming). One question I had was what it implied about ‘closure’—that is, believing the logical consequences of other things you believe. For example, I find it hard to make sense of someone who believes p, believes if p, q, and doesn’t believe q, but who is not at all disposed, when these attitudes are brought to mind, to believe q. Worsnip’s account thus seems to imply that it is incoherent—regardless of whether these attitudes are brought to mind—to believe p, believe if p, q, and fail to believe q. Inspired by Gilbert Harman (1986), many deny this—coherence doesn’t require us to ‘clutter’ our minds in this way. Indeed, elsewhere in the book Worsnip denies that structural rationality requires closure under modus ponens, for reasons related to the preface paradox (301, n.40). But I didn’t see how his account of incoherence avoided this result.

The issue about the normativity of structural rationality can be understood in different ways; Worsnip provides a helpful review. Following one strand of Niko Kolodny’s pioneering discussion (2005: 547–8), he takes the central challenge to concern the deliberative role of coherence. Reasons are characteristically relevant in deliberation. But when we ask ourselves what to do, or what to think, facts about coherence seem redundant: ‘When I deliberate about whether to believe p, I just think directly about my evidence for p. I don’t think about whether believing p makes me coherent’ (249).

Like his account of coherence, Worsnip’s answer to this challenge begins from a striking and underappreciated observation. Our deliberation tends to exhibit a kind of holism. For instance, we don’t first deliberate about whether to believe p and then, with that settled, consider whether to believe not-p. We treat both questions together, taking one to settle the other. Similarly, if we know that a means is necessary for an end we are considering, we don’t treat the question of whether to intend the end separately from the question of whether to intend the means. We take our options to be intending the end and also the means, or intending neither. Worsnip suggests that in deliberating this way, we are responding to considerations of coherence. Coherence matters by providing reasons to structure deliberation: the incoherence of both believing p and believing not-p, and of intending an end but not what we take to be the necessary means, is a reason to treat these combinations as ‘off limits’ and consider only coherent combinations of attitudes. This proposal explains, Worsnip suggests, how coherence can play a role in deliberation, but in a way that drops out of view once you’re considering the merits of the options (258).

This is another original and stimulating proposal. Worsnip’s case for it is that it finds a potential deliberative role for coherence. However, we should also ask whether his proposal provides the best explanation of why it is appropriate to deliberate holistically. If more attractive explanations are available, the proposal will lack positive motivation.

One alternative explanation would appeal to what Worsnip earlier calls the ‘Guarantee Hypothesis’ (54–5), according to which incoherence guarantees substantive irrationality. If it held, this hypothesis could explain the holism of deliberation. Why treat incoherent combinations as off limits? Because incoherence ensures you’ll have some attitude you shouldn’t. This would seem like a compelling reason not to consider such combinations. Indeed, since the deliberating agent is concerned with what they should do or think, this answer wears its deliberative significance on its face—to my mind, more so than Worsnip’s appeal to coherence. However, Worsnip argues (and for what it’s worth, I agree—e.g., Way 2018) that the Guarantee Hypothesis does not hold in full generality.

Another explanation might appeal to certain ‘worldly’ facts corresponding to coherent combinations. Suppose I am considering whether to attend the conference in Auckland, for which I’ll need to fly. Why don’t I consider attending the conference without flying? Because I can’t. That is, the fact that flying is necessary for attending seems a compelling reason not to consider intending to attend without intending to fly.[2] Or suppose I’m considering who will win the World Cup this year. Why don’t I consider believing that Brazil will win and also that France will win? Because they can’t both do so: the fact that Brazil and France can’t both win seems a compelling reason not to believe both that Brazil will win and that France will. As with the Guarantee Hypothesis, these answers seem to have immediate deliberative significance, in so far as deliberation concerns what to do and what’s true. These answers thus also strike me as somewhat more natural than Worsnip’s, although again there are questions about how to generalise from these examples. In any event, I hope that Worsnip’s discussion will lead to further consideration of the deliberative phenomenon he has identified.

I want to end by raising a more general question. Worsnip insists that on his view, structural rationality and substantive rationality are ‘equally genuine kinds of rationality’ (ix). I wondered what made this so. How is rationality as such to be characterised on Worsnip’s view? Without an answer to this question, it’s unclear why both structural and substantive rationality count as forms of it.

Worsnip might think this issue is terminological (see e.g., 98–9). He certainly thinks—plausibly—that the term ‘rational’ and its cognates is ordinarily used in connection with both coherence and reasons responsiveness (4). Maybe this is all there is to it; there is no further underlying unity. However, this interpretation makes less sense of points at which it seems to matter to Worsnip whether something counts as a form of rationality. For instance, he insists that immorality is a type of (substantive) irrationality, while acknowledging that ordinary language hesitates on whether this is the case (287–8). And he criticises some social scientists for using a notion of rationality which takes into account people’s actual goals together with the evidence they possess (not their actual beliefs). For Worsnip this is a ‘confused amalgam of structural and substantive rationality’ (289). But the notion doesn’t seem far from ordinary language, and we might wonder whether it has some use and purpose.

Worsnip is also clear that incoherence is a kind of defect, and a potential basis for criticism (30ff, 161ff). This might suggest a more substantive answer to our question: perhaps rationality as such can be understood in terms of a certain kind of criticism. However it is worked out, this answer raises a worry: how can the charge of irrational incoherence count as a criticism if it does not involve the claim that you have reasons to be otherwise? This is an issue because, although Worsnip thinks that considerations of coherence are reasons to structure deliberation, he denies that structural rationality is to be understood in terms of reasons. The charge of structural rationality is not a charge of having failed to heed good reasons.

Worsnip is aware of this concern, but is unmoved by it. He holds that many criticisms assert only that someone falls short of an evaluative standard—e.g., that something they did was unskillful, or unfunny, or lacking in empathy. They need not involve the claim that the person failed to correctly respond to reasons (29ff, also 247). Here my sympathies are with Worsnip’s opponents. Of course, Worsnip is right that we can assess people with reference to an evaluative standard without taking there to be reasons to take account of that standard. But it is much less clear that we can criticise with reference to a standard while disavowing any reasons to take account of it. To say that the eulogy was unfunny need be no criticism, because here there need be no reason to try to be funny.[3]

There is a close relative of Worsnip’s view which avoids this worry, and allows a simple account of rationality as such. On this view, facts about incoherence are reasons against the corresponding combination of attitudes. For instance, the fact that it’s incoherent to believe p and believe not-p is a reason against both believing p and believing not-p. Plausibly, these reasons will be unopposed; thus, correctly responding to your reasons requires coherence.[4]

On this view, to be rational as such is to correctly respond to your reasons. But the view can agree with Worsnip on almost everything else. Structural rationality is a genuine and distinctive form of rationality, since it involves responding to a distinctive kind of reason—reasons of coherence. (Compare: epistemic rationality is a matter of responding correctly to epistemic reasons). The view can also agree with Worsnip about what unifies coherence. And it allows for a good sense in which structural rationality is autonomous—it is not reducible to correctly responding to other reasons. So the view captures a great deal of what Worsnip wants, while also allowing a unified account of rationality.[5] The possibility—and attraction—of such a view calls into question whether Worsnip’s core claims are best developed so as to insist on the fundamental distinctness of coherence and reasons-responsiveness.[6]

Worsnip’s book contains a great deal that I’ve not touched on. It clearly succeeds in its ambition to show the significance of distinguishing structural and substantive rationality across a wide-range of issues, and it makes a powerful case for understanding the distinction as Worsnip proposes. It is highly recommended for anyone with interests connected to questions about rationality.


Thanks to Southampton’s Normativity Reading Group for valuable discussions of this book, and Alex Gregory, Conor McHugh, Daniel Whiting, and Alex Worsnip for helpful comments on a draft of this review.


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Broome, J. 2005. Does Rationality Give Us Reasons? Philosophical Issues 15: 321–337.

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Daoust, M. Forthcoming. Structural Rationality and the Property of Coherence. Pacific Philosophical Quarterly.

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Kiesewetter, B. 2017. The Normativity of Rationality. Oxford University Press.

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Lord, E. 2018. The Importance of Being Rational. Oxford University Press.

Scanlon, T.M. 1998. What We Owe To Each Other. Harvard University Press.

Way, J. 2010a. Defending the Wide-Scope Approach to Instrumental Reason. Philosophical Studies 147: 213–233.

Way, J. 2010b. The Normativity of Rationality. Philosophy Compass 5: 1057–1068.

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[1] Some requirements govern combinations of attitudes and absences of attitudes—e.g., the requirement against intending the end but not intending the means believed to be necessary. For brevity, I use ‘attitudes’ to include such absences.

[2] If in fact I can attend without flying, my belief to the contrary still grounds a ‘subjective’ or ‘belief-relative’ reason not to intend the one without the other. Compare Way 2010a.

[3] Scanlon (1998: 27) makes a similar point about Bernard Williams’ claim that we can criticise what someone did as, e.g., cruel or selfish, while allowing—as per Williams’ internalism about reasons—that they may have had no reason to do otherwise.

[4] In some ways, this view is closer to formulations of ‘wide-scope in spirit’ views prior to Broome 2005 and Kolodny 2005, which were typically put as claims about reasons or oughts. See e.g., Darwall 1983; Broome 1999; Dancy 2000.

[5] The view has other attractions too. In particular, it more fully answers the worry that it is hard to make sense of requirements which are neither normative (like moral requirements) nor conventional (like requirements of etiquette) (30–31). In my view, the central worry here is that it is unclear what requirements might consist in, if not the balance of certain reasons or certain social facts (Way 2010b: 1065; 2018: 491; Kiesewetter 2017: 42–43). Another potential attraction is the view’s fit with a ‘reasons first’ approach to normativity.

[6] At one point, Worsnip briefly considers whether facts about coherence might be reasons against combinations of attitudes. He worries that it is unclear how such reasons could be the ‘right kind’ of reasons (267–268). This issue is important—e.g., for showing why they will be unopposed—but does not seem decisive