Five Modes of Scepticism: Sextus Empiricus and the Agrippan Modes

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Stefan Sienkiewicz, Five Modes of Scepticism: Sextus Empiricus and the Agrippan Modes, Oxford University Press, 2019, 204pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198798361.

Reviewed by Richard Bett, Johns Hopkins University


The Modes are standardized forms of argument employed by the Pyrrhonian skeptics to induce suspension of judgment. The Five Modes are the most general of these, and have excited a fair amount of interest among contemporary epistemologists -- often under the heading The Agrippan Trilemma (focusing on the three most important ones). They are mentioned both by Diogenes Laertius, who ascribes them to the otherwise unknown Agrippa, and by Sextus Empiricus. But the treatment in Diogenes is extremely sketchy, whereas Sextus not only introduces them, but frequently uses them in discussing particular topics. Hence, not surprisingly, Sextus' treatment is generally seen as much the more philosophically interesting. As far as I know, this is the first book-length examination of them for almost 30 years, the last being Jonathan Barnes' The Toils of Scepticism (Cambridge, 1990).

A central concern of Stefan Sienkiewicz is to be really precise about whose suspension of judgment these Modes aim to generate, and how. Previous treatments (Barnes is a central example of this) have tended to analyze them in such a way that their efficacy depends on accepting certain philosophical or other theoretical commitments. This may be fine for the character Sextus calls the Dogmatist -- that is, the person with definite philosophical views. But it will not work for the skeptics themselves, who by definition avoid all such views. Yet Sextus is very clear that the Modes are devices for the skeptic to get (or keep) suspension of judgment, not just devices for critiquing the Dogmatist (though they are that too). Thus the ways the Modes work on a skeptic must be different from how they have generally been reconstructed in the past, and Sienkiewicz devotes much attention to elucidating what these may have been. The exercise is very ingenious and, though he builds to some extent on work by Benjamin Morison[1], highly original. Even if one is not persuaded by all his conclusions, a further great merit of the book is the really detailed attention he gives to what Sextus tells us -- often much more briefly and cryptically than we would like -- about how these Modes are supposed to work.

After an introduction come five chapters, one devoted to each of the Five Modes, and then a sixth chapter that examines how they may have worked together as a system. The first chapter is on the Mode that Sextus himself mentions first: Disagreement. Sextus says that if there is an unresolved disagreement on some topic, we have no way to decide between the alternatives, and so we suspend judgment. But why? If the answer relies on some principle maintaining that, in such circumstances, one is not rationally justified in accepting either alternative, this Mode may be suitable for a Dogmatist, but it will not work for a skeptic. To get a skeptic to suspension of judgment, a move of the form "If there are no decisive reasons either for or against P, then S should suspend judgment over P" (42 and elsewhere) is required that does not carry any theoretical commitment. But this, Sienkiewicz argues, is just the move Sextus describes when introducing skepticism as an ability to generate suspension of judgment through the presentation of opposing considerations of "equal strength" (isostheneia, PH 1.8 -- Sienkiewicz calls this "equipollence", following the Annas and Barnes translation). Thus there is a way of understanding the Mode of Disagreement in which it is simply equivalent to Sextus' normal skeptical method, and on this understanding, the Mode of Disagreement is, of course, available to a skeptic.

This leaves wide open the kinds of considerations that might produce "equal strength", which is perhaps why this Mode is often seen as an opening move rather than as complete in itself. One of Sienkiewicz's more interesting suggestions is that three other Modes -- those of Hypothesis, Infinite Regress, and Reciprocity -- are in effect (at least, in the versions available to the skeptics themselves) particular specifications of the form of argument captured in the Mode of Disagreement. The next three chapters tackle each of these Modes in that order.

The Mode of Hypothesis challenges someone who simply asserts something without providing grounds for the assertion. The way a skeptic can get from this to suspension of judgment is by simply asserting something incompatible with the previous assertion, and asking, why is one of these assertions any less persuasive than the other? Faced with two conflicting assertions, both lacking any further justification, one has no way to choose between them and so one suspends judgment. And this need not depend on any epistemological principles (though if played out on a Dogmatist, it might); it could just result from a habit of mind the skeptic has acquired -- either through normal upbringing, or through having previously held, but subsequently shed, an epistemological view that would declare it irrational to accept bare assertions. (Such alternatives, associated with what Sienkiewicz calls the Content and Grounds Interpretations of the skeptic's avoidance of definite views, appear several times in the book; there is not space here to explore this interesting dimension of his argument.)

The Mode of Infinite Regress drives one to keep providing justifications for one's claims, in the form of further claims themselves needing justification, without end. And the Mode of Reciprocity objects to using as justification for a claim something that already depended on that very claim for its own justification. (Sienkiewicz, like many other interpreters, treats the latter as simply a special case of circular argument. Logically speaking, this may be correct; but it does look as if Sextus meant to confine this Mode to the case of just two claims supposedly justifying one another.[2]) In both cases, it is not too hard to construct arguments that will drive a Dogmatist (if persuaded by the premises) to suspension of judgment, but that depend for this effect on the endorsement of certain norms of rationality. So again, the question is, how can the skeptic reach suspension of judgment using these tools? In both cases, Sienkiewicz's answer is structurally parallel to the case of Hypothesis: the skeptic may drive the Dogmatist into an infinite regress, or into attempting to support two claims with one another, but will then construct another infinite regress, or another reciprocal argument, directed towards a conclusion opposite to the Dogmatist's own. These pairs of opposing arguments will then balance one another in the same way as two rival hypotheses, or any two arguments possessing the feature of "equal strength", and suspension of judgment will result without any reliance on epistemic principles.

The Mode of Relativity, as Sextus presents it, is the anomaly among the Five. One reason is that, unlike the others, it has a counterpart in the quite different set of Ten Modes, and Sextus appears to treat the two as equivalent. But the fundamental problem is that, however one unpacks it -- and Sienkiewicz works hard to get some sense out of Sextus' confusing remarks on the subject -- the Mode of Relativity, as it figures in Sextus' Five Modes, is plainly inconsistent with the Mode of Disagreement (and hence, presumably, although Sienkiewicz does not say this, with all the others, if they are particular instantiations of the Mode of Disagreement). It just doesn't seem to belong here.

For this reason the Mode of Relativity is ignored in the final chapter, which considers how the other four might work together. Sextus certainly suggests that they do in the chapter where he introduces the Five Modes, and elsewhere he appeals not infrequently to more than one together (although only very occasionally to all four). Sienkiewicz considers four different ways of combining them ("nets", as he calls them, following Barnes). Two of these are based on Sextus' own suggestions -- which is impressive in itself; other scholars have shied away from this, and have regarded at least the first as a baffling mess. The third is based on a schema from Barnes, and the fourth is a minor variation on this that includes all four Modes. The trouble he finds with all these is that there is no way to make them available for the skeptic's own use -- that is, to make them work without epistemological commitments -- in the way that was done in previous chapters for the individual Modes. They may be effective against the dogmatists, but they cannot consistently be used in combination by the skeptic themselves. As Sienkiewicz suggests in closing (191), this need not bother the skeptic; but it is perhaps a surprise given the emphasis Sextus seemed to place on their systematicity.

I hope I have conveyed some sense of the intellectual excitement of this book, despite having had to skate over a great many details. Sienkiewicz really does dig deeper than anyone else in investigating what exactly is going on, or could consistently be going on, in Sextus' version of the Five Modes. His grasp of Sextus' text, and his philosophical rigor, are never in doubt. And in focusing on the Modes specifically as they could function for a skeptic, he is broaching an important topic that other scholars have generally neglected. This is not a book for beginners; it presupposes a relatively sophisticated grasp of Pyrrhonian skepticism, and the argument is at times quite intricate. But for those with the requisite background, it is absolutely worth the effort. In what follows I will note just three reservations.

First, a word on the centrality of the Five Modes. Sienkiewicz says that "these modes lie at the heart of the sceptic's argumentative practice" (2); I suspect many would agree. But this seems to me an exaggeration. They are much less commonly appealed to outside contexts that we would call epistemological -- that is, in the majority of Sextus's surviving oeuvre. In addition, they appear considerably more often in Outlines of Pyrrhonism than in Sextus' other works -- and Outlines is, as he frequently reminds us, only an outline; when not constrained by space, he seems less interested in them[3]. This thought would need considerable filling out; but I would caution against viewing the Five Modes as an indispensible feature of ancient Pyrrhonism -- much of the time Sextus gets along fine without mentioning them at all. Having said that, I would of course not deny that they are an important tool (especially in epistemology).

Second, on Relativity. Sienkiewicz is not the first to find this Mode, in Sextus' version of it, out of place in the Five Modes, and it is hard to disagree. Since the Modes as Sextus presents them is his theme, there is a sense in which I cannot fault him. However, I cannot help feeling that this is a place where his single-minded concentration on the Five Modes as Sextus presents them gives an incomplete picture. As already noted, there are similar Relativity Modes in both the Five Modes and the Ten. Now, a further point is that in his initial listing of the Five Modes (PH 1.165-9), Sextus places the Relativity Mode third, between infinite regress and hypothesis. Sienkiewicz notes this (6, n.19; 125), but does not attempt to make anything of it. What he does not note is that the very same order appears in Diogenes Laertius' listing of the Five Modes. Since neither is borrowing from the other, this must be the standard order of the Five Modes. And that may lead one to wonder what function an argument concerning relativity might have had in that position. Some recent work has plausibly answered that question, based on a hint in Diogenes Laertius[4]: the original Relativity Mode blocked attempts to justify some claim by means of itself (rather than, as in the case of Hypothesis, doing without justification altogether). If this is right, the original Relativity Mode in the Five was in fact very different from the Relativity Mode in the Ten; Sextus has tried to assimilate the two, with the messy result Sienkiewicz aptly describes. Again, I quite agree about the messiness; I just think that this diagnosis (which would again, of course, need much more development) makes the mess more understandable.

Finally, I find the proposed skeptic-friendly versions of these Modes more convincing in some cases than in others. In the case of the Mode of Hypothesis, Sienkiewicz seems to me spot on. When he uses the Mode of Hypothesis, Sextus does indeed refer a number of times to bringing up an opposite hypothesis, which will be just as good as the first; and this is central to the progress towards suspension of judgment. But the analogous moves in the case of Infinite Regress and Reciprocity have absolutely no textual support; they are purely speculative reconstructions. Sextus never says anything along the lines of "Now I'm going to lay out another, opposite infinite regress [or reciprocal argument]". One may of course discuss how a certain philosopher could have supported or saved a certain position, without worrying about whether this is suggested in the text. But if this is supposed to describe what Sextus was actually up to, I am not so sure.

That naturally invites the question "So how else did Sextus employ these Modes in a skeptical vein?" One possibility might be to broaden our conception of what opposing considerations, and "equal strength" in argument, amount to. If we consider the ragbag of considerations that Sextus actually gives us for and against many of the views he discusses, it seems that he has a pretty relaxed attitude to this. "Equal strength" is purely a matter of what you can get your opponent, or yourself, to find equally attractive on any given occasion, by hook or by crook. It certainly need not involve lining up structurally analogous forms of argument on either side. Maybe, on a given occasion, catching the Dogmatist in an infinite regress, or in a reciprocal argument, will prompt the skeptic to think "I might as well believe the opposite" -- and that, coupled with the Dogmatist's positive argument, will count as a case of "equal strength". Of course, this might not satisfy a logically scrupulous philosopher. But would anyone want to apply that label to Sextus?

[1] "Sexus Empiricus", Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (2014); also "The Sceptic's Modes of Argumentation", in T. Bénatouïl and K. Ierodiakonou (eds.), Dialectic after Plato and Aristotle (Cambridge, 2019), 283-319, which appeared too recently for Sienkiewicz to cite.

[2] J. Bullock, "The Challenge of the Modes of Agrippa", Apeiron 49 (2016), 409-35, is good on this.

[3] I give details in "The Modes in Sextus: Theory and Practice", in R. Bett, How to be a Pyrrhonist: The Practice and Significance of Pyrrhonian Skepticism (Cambridge, 2019), 108-29, at 125-7.

[4] T. Brennan and J. Lee, "A Relative Improvement", Phronesis 59 (2014), 246-71, and Bullock 2016 cited in n.2 above. Sienkiewicz cites Brennan and Lee, but says that it is not relevant to his concerns. I guess my point is, I wish he had thought it was.