Fixing Language: An Essay on Conceptual Engineering

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Herman Cappelen, Fixing Language: An Essay on Conceptual Engineering, Oxford University Press, 2018, 212pp., $42.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780198814719.

Reviewed by Jon Cogburn, Louisiana State University


In this lovely and important book, Herman Cappelen organizes and contributes to a rapidly growing literature involving the idea that a, or perhaps the, central role of philosophy is the improvement of concepts. The paramount virtue of his own "austerity" account is that it neither makes improving human beings seem unrealistically easy, nor misconstrues arguments about the world's facts (including the facts about what ought to be the case) as a pointless contest of what middle-era Richard Rorty used to call "vocabularies."

For Cappelen, contexts where externalist discursive norms hold sway are contexts where conceptual revision is extraordinarily difficult, since it then requires changing the world. On the other hand, since internalist discursive norms permit a change in meaning merely in virtue of changing how we talk about the world, contexts where internalist norms hold sway are ones where revision is too easy, always in danger of changing nothing other than the sounds we make. The argument for this tension, which I hereby baptize "Cappelen's Dilemma," is by my lights the central achievement of the book.

First, some terminology. Semantic internalism is, strictly speaking, the view that the meaning of locutions in a person's idiolect are entirely dependent upon facts about that person. The broader internalist philosophical tradition criticized by canonical externalist works (e.g., Putnam, Burge, Kripke) was, in addition, semantically universal. That is to say, by analogy with moral universalism, that all meaning facts were taken to be the kind of things that could be represented by a finite theory which would decide for us in novel cases how people ought to use language.

However, if one understands Cappelen's "externalism" along the lines of something like the way we tended to understand Ruth Millikan's early teleo-semantics, non-internalist yet still universalist, then one has completely misunderstood both what he means by "externalism" as well as his main point. For Cappelen, to be externalist is itself to be fundamentally hostile to the endeavor of seeking to offer a semantically universal "theory of meaning." It is to, using the terminology of Jonathan Dancy and meta-semantics of John McDowell, be a semantic particularist.

Since "conceptual engineering" is, for creatures like us, engineering of word meanings, for the semantic particularist:

(v) Conceptual engineering. . . is a process we have little or no control over -- it's also not transparent to us when we engage in it.

(vi) The process governing particular changes is typically incomprehensible and inscrutable. (p. 53)

And since the proper use of words is determined in non-algorithmic ways from a variety of overlapping causal/normative sources (what Cappelen calls "the semantic base"):

(x) Conceptual engineering. . . changes the world not just the meaning of words.

For Cappelen, meaning typically changes as a function of the change of the largely inscrutable factors, both "internal" and "external", that in some sense ground meanings.

Cappelen centers his discussion via several important contemporary examples that one might consider conceptual engineering. These serve both as existence proofs of this as a subfield of philosophy and as friction for his discussions about what conceptual engineering is and ought to be. The examples include: (1) Andy Clark and Chalmers' argument in "The Extended Mind" on 'believes that'; (2) Sally Haslanger's argument in a series of papers concerning gender concepts expressed by terms such as "woman" and "man"; (3) treatments of basic moral concepts like good and right by meta-ethicists such as Peter Railton and Richard Joyce; (4) the kinds of thing one must say about truth in light of the paradoxes, though Cappelen endorses Kevin Scharp's claim that Graham Priest's suggested revisions to our concept of logical consequence show that he is not a revisionist about truth (cf. the analogous claim made by Wittgenstein-inspired philosophers such as D.Z. Phillips who seek to be non-revisionary expressivists); (5) many epistemologists, paradigmatically Matt Weiner who takes our concept of knowledge to be inconsistent; (6) analogous to Weiner on knowledge, Peter Van Inwagen on 'freedom', and (7) philosophers of race such as Anthony Appiah who argue that the very concept of race presupposes empirically false views.

Everyone assayed by Cappelen holds that the concepts under discussion lead us to some combination of misunderstanding the world and acting badly. Moreover, while the concepts broached in the previous paragraph all concern specific domains such as ethics and epistemology, from the beginning analytic philosophers (e.g., Russell, Frege, Carnap, and Quine) have taken language to be in need of global reformation because of vagueness and inconsistency found everywhere prior to philosophy's ministrations. This venerable tradition, combined with the recent self-consciousness about revision of concepts, leads philosophers such as Simon Blackburn, Chalmers, Matti Eklund, and Mark Richard to suggest, each in different ways, that philosophy might just be conceptual engineering. Instead of merely describing the world, all along we've been writing books about changing (at least how we describe) it.

Unfortunately though, if that's what philosophy really is, then one can argue that there isn't much point to it. In this context, Cappelen extensively discusses P.F. Strawson's claim that non-trivial conceptual revision (specifically, Carnap's project of "explication") merely changes the subject. The initial worry is that there is no real difference between, for example, on the one hand, the relativist who thinks we should give up correspondence platitudes about truth and adopt the claim that "true" just marks out what our society lets us get away with saying, and on the other hand the eliminativist who thinks there is no such thing as "true". The revisionist wants us to stop using unamended concepts. But if they are "changing the subject" then they are eliminativists after all!

There is a deeper related point, which Cappelen doesn't explicitly make, but which greatly helps clarify his dilemma. Remember that according to Dummett's and Putnam's influential interpretations, Quine's great discovery was the indeterminacy between ontology and ideology, an indeterminacy that entails that when we revise our beliefs about the world, it is not at all clear to us whether anything rationally compels us to determine that we are talking about the same thing but have new beliefs (revision of belief without meaning change) versus determining that we are talking about something new (new meanings, typically coupled with eliminativism about what we used to be talking about).

Whether an actual engineer decides to fix, replace, or destroy a machine makes quite a difference. But, according to Quine, at least via Putnam and Dummett, it is not clear if this is the case with concepts or word meanings. So, for example, we somehow collectively decided that phlogiston does not exist (change of ontology) and that prior to quantum theory people had false beliefs about atoms (change of ideology). But it is just a part of some combination of the slack between mind/language and world (cf. Wilson 1982) as well as the insusceptibility to algorithm of the meaning facts themselves (Wilson 2008), that, for all we know, language could have evolved such that we correctly describe the relevant discoveries as phlogiston being valence electrons (change of ideology) and atoms not existing (change of ontology).

From the perspective of Putnam and Dummett's Quine, it is not clear why any case of conceptual revision couldn't have been described as replacement and vice versa. This, perhaps is the deep reason that we should not be overly concerned with charges of "changing the subject." And defenders of conceptual revision presented by Cappelen each in their own way argue that if their new and improved concept achieves the good of the replaced one with fewer of its flaws, then why worry about "changing the subject"?

Though Cappelen does not explicitly discuss Quinean inextricability of meaning from background belief, one of the five parts of the book ("Part III. Toward a General Theory 2: Topic Continuity as the Limits of Revision") is best understood in terms of modelling the decision to hold ontology fixed even when our beliefs are radically revised. Cappelen considers cases where the usage of a predicate term changes so much that we would say its intension changes. That is, where there is a change in the norms governing the set of possible objects to which the term clearly, or perhaps just paradigmatically (for prototype and exemplar accounts), applies. This often happens when revising our beliefs about the world in light of radical changes in the world or our engagement with it (Wilson 1982), for example, "married" after the lessening of state sanctioned discrimination against gay people, or "salad" after a generation of French chefs found inspiration in Japanese cuisine.

If word meanings are intensions, that is, if the meaning of predicates is determined in some manner by the set of actual and counterfactual things to which the predicates are true, then in all such cases the meaning of the words have changed. But, as Cappelen shows, in many such cases disquotational and anaphoric practice goes on much as before. I can discuss the regrettable use of Jell-O in 1970s American salads in the same conversation in which I order shaved fennel stitched into a tiny nest with flash frozen parmesan cheese emulsions serving as "eggs." That is, if "disagreement about meaning" really is just an agreement not to talk any more (so long as one is, pace mid-period Rorty, a realist about norms governing the conditions under which we should no longer kibbutz), then disagreement (or change) in intension isn't always a disagreement (or change) in meaning.

Cappelen's solution to this is to argue that what is preserved in cases where we decide the ontology has not shifted are "topics," which "are more coarse-grained than extensions and intensions, and so expressions that differ with respect to extensions and intensions can be about the same topic." (101) While he does a very good job showing how pragmatic norms involving disquotation, anaphora, and such motivate commitment to topics, he does not give us anything about how the semantics and pragmatics of topics and intensions might be formally modelled in the manner in which defenders of semantic dualisms doing similar work (such as varieties of narrow/wide content and Chalmersian two-dimensionalism) typically provide.

For our purposes, we needn't further explore this though, since we are now in a position to fully grasp Cappelen's Dilemma, which should be understood as a replacement challenge to the traditional Strawsonian worry about changing the subject. The first premise is that cases of revision involving some key terms are either described as: (1) the meaning of the terms in question being changed, or (2) the meaning being unchanged while key collateral beliefs are revised. Note that this disjunct is not meant to preclude the Quinean (via Putnam and Dummett) indeterminacy discussed earlier. Nor does it preclude bifurcation of meaning along any of the meaning dualisms (e.g., traditional narrow/broad content, Chalmersian primary/secondary intension, or Cappelen's intension/topic) on offer in the literature.

The first horn of Cappelen's Dilemma, then, concerns the paramount danger in cases where it is appropriate to say that meaning has shifted. The problem here is not the challenge to our anaphoric and disquotational practices of same-saying (making this clear is much of the point of Cappelen's extended discussion of topics). Rather, it stems from the fact that in such cases sets of beliefs, at least in the sense relevant to associated assertions, are individuating meanings. Here revision is a matter of just changing some of the appropriate assertions we took to be central to the meaning of the term.

Good so far, but the problem is that the normative contexts where beliefs individuate meaning are also the normative contexts where holist intuitions about meaning tend to hold sway. And this makes revision much too easy, and consequentially always in danger of being trivial. Consider if the government suddenly mandated adopting the belief that all embryos are human lives. And suppose that from that point forward everyone who ever asserted something equivalent to "fertilized eggs are not human lives" was met by the kind of incomprehension that once greeted the non-Larkanian poets of the modern era when they shared their more schizophasiac efforts with the rest of us.

If such a situation happened in a world reasonably similar to ours, would people suddenly shut down all of the fertility clinics and save all of the frozen fertilized eggs scheduled to be destroyed? Would heterosexual couples trying to get pregnant suddenly start having funerals for all of the fertilized eggs that never attach to the uterine wall? Of course not. They would either blithely go on inconsistently, as one does in the actual world, or if forced to be consistent, simply adjust other parts of the conceptual scheme (murder versus killing, just versus unjust killing, killing versus letting die, etc.) so that behavior would not need to change. In the possible worlds similar to our own (albeit with enough political changes to the point where the mandated linguistic revision would actually take), nothing whatsoever (over and above what already made the revision possible) about either the philosophical or political situation involving abortion would change at all. The conceptual revolutionary's absolute victory would in the end be entirely pyrrhic.

Cappelen's book raises the prospect that all of the suggested revisions he is assaying might be similarly futile. If the revision is just a matter of getting people to change the set of sentences they assert, the holistic nature of assertion revision makes it possible to do that and not really, as a result of the revision itself, change anything that matters.

Part of the virtue of externalism, broadly conceived, is that it illustrates nicely where such wide-eyed holism breaks down. If our linguistic and conceptual behavior is answerable to normative facts external to us, then as long as we continue to be responsive to such facts, there will be limits to how much we can adjust collateral beliefs in the service of maintaining a defective conceptual scheme (for an extended discussion of this point, see the presentation of the Putnam-Parmenides Paradox in Cogburn 2017). And since our flourishing, indeed survival, often does depend on being appropriately answerable to the appropriate normative facts, we are not really free to believe whatever we want even in cases involving conceptual upheaval.

Unfortunately for the conceptual revisionary, this is precisely where the other horn bites. Cases where we are likely to say the meaning has not changed (the second horn) are precisely those cases where externalist semantic norms hold sway! If, for example, the semantic base of "Gold" is just whatever natural kind we were talking about when we pointed at stuff and called it "gold," then radically different changes of belief about gold will be consistent with no shift in meaning about "gold". In such a case, changing the meaning of "gold" would require some sort of time-travelly science fictional intervention that physically alters the natural kind we've been talking about all along.

Of course we could try to stop talking about gold, or even opt for internalist norms and talk about something else using the word "gold." But in the context of the admissibility of externalist norms, the problem for the conceptual revisionary here is not that we might go internalist and "change the meaning" but rather that the stuff we talked about previously is still out there.

This is not the kind of standard etiolated consideration we might, in too revealing contexts, call "merely philosophical". Anyone who thinks they know the long-term effects of such revisions should, in light of Cappelen's Dilemma, re-examine Rorty's recently much quoted prophetic late writings about political correctness and the further Trumpification of people who for whatever reasons are not able get with the new linguistic regimes with which we the non-aliterate abuse one another on social media. For Western philosophers, it's entirely too natural to overestimate what talking and writing can accomplish by way of helping us better realize the good, beautiful, and true.

On the other hand, if there is any reason for joy in light of Cappelen's Dilemma, maybe it is this: if conceptual revision were too easy, then it would much more easily be put to nefarious uses. And this in the end may be what really protects us from an Orwellian reality. Not the heroic activity of conceptual revisers on the side of the good, true, and beautiful, but rather in the fact that the good, the true, and the beautiful (typically via properties "thicker" in their marriage of the normative and descriptive (cf. Zagzebski 1996)) are semantic bases out there in the world guiding us back to them no matter what others might lead us to say and try to get us to think. Note that for Hegelian externalists like McDowell, even natural kinds like gold are in "the space of reasons" and in some sense always already normatively guiding our proper answerability to the world.

This normative aspect of reality, something that transcends yet grounds language, is what Chinese and Japanese philosophers (e.g., Izutsu 2001) refer to as the Tao. But it is not completely foreign to people who don't consider meditative practice part of philosophical methodology. Post-Kantian Western continental philosophy has long grappled with it in ways relevant to worries about the limits of conceptualization, albeit often motivated by, and sometimes partially motivating (as with the Kyoto School), Eastern philosophy (e.g., Priest 2003). With respect to analytic philosophy, in addition to Dancy's moral and McDowell's semantic particularisms, in this context we should never forget Russell's moving conclusion to The Problems of Philosophy, where he argues that humility is one of the two (along with a heightened sense of the possible) epistemic/moral goods produced by proper reflection on Western philosophy's successes and failures. Anyone sensitive to Russell's wisdom will at least be open to finding Cappelen's intervention in these debates dispositive.


Cogburn, Jon (2017). Cartesian Meditations. University of Edinburgh Press.

Izutsu, Toshihiko (2001). Towards a Philosophy of Zen Buddhism. Shambala.

Priest, Graham (2003). Beyond the Limits of Thought. Oxford University Press.

Wilson, Mark (1982). Predicate meets property. The Philosophical Review 91 (4): 549-89.

Wilson, Mark (2008). Wandering Significance: An Essay on Conceptual Behavior. Oxford University Press.

Zagzebski, Linda. 1996. Virtues of the Mind: An Inquiry into the Nature of Virtue and the Ethical Foundations of Knowledge. Cambridge University Press.