Fixing Reference

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Imogen Dickie, Fixing Reference, Oxford University Press, 2015, 333pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198755616.

Reviewed by Eros Corazza, The University of the Basque Country


In this challenging and welcome contribution, Imogen Dickie presents an interesting account of a rich debate that has occupied, among others, philosophers of language and mind over the last few decades. The debate concerns how our thoughts and utterances relate to the objects we end up thinking and talking about. If I say "Donald Trump is the new president of the USA" or "He (pointing to Trump) is the new president of the USA", I am, from an intuitive viewpoint, saying the same thing -- that Donald Trump is the new president of the USA -- and I am thinking about the same individual -- my thoughts are about Donald Trump. The same is true if Trump utters "I am the new president of the USA". Intuitively, we say the same thing in different ways. How is it that our utterances and the corresponding beliefs we express are about the same individual, Donald Trump? Besides, how is it that my tokening (and thinking episode) is about Trump and not, say, Barack Obama, Hillary Clinton, someone else or nothing at all? This is one of the challenging questions that Dickie tackles. The basic idea is that the 'aboutness' of our thoughts is cognitively motivated. For it rests on a notion of cognitive focus, i.e. on the way the thinker focuses her thoughts on a given object. The interpretation developed in the book incorporates both the insights of the causalist picture (roughly, the view that a tokened singular term relates to its referent via a causal chain of reference) and the descriptivist picture (roughly, the view that a tokened singular term is about an object insofar as the latter satisfies the descriptive content the speaker associates to the term she entertains). In brief, some 'aboutness-fixing' is causally driven while some is descriptively driven.

To deal with this and related questions Dickie proposes a two-components theory. The first component is characterized as reference and justification and the second as the need to represent mind-independent items.

The starting point for Dickie's understanding of the first component rests on the notion of a body of beliefs that the speaker or thinker holds and the way they come together in connecting to the same referent. That is, on how the thinker's relevant body of beliefs converges on the object of thought. Convergence on the same object is also what helps to group the beliefs together. Furthermore, the relation between a (singular) thought and the referent is established by the way the relevant beliefs are justified in converging upon the relevant object. The thinker/speaker is justified in holding a singular thought about an object inasmuch as the latter is the unique individual upon which (i) the set of beliefs to which the thought belongs converge and (ii) the thinker is justified in holding them (roughly, in taking them to be about the very same object). For, if one wants her beliefs to be true, one should try to be sure that they are justified. How justification works also depends on the way one discharges enough beliefs that are not true about the object of thought. Thus, a given set of beliefs is about an object o if and only if the means of justification for its members converge on o and the thinker would be unfortunate if her beliefs do not match o. In the case of demonstrative beliefs, expressed by saying 'this F' or 'that F', the justification rests on perception, i.e. the perceptual connection the subject has with the object. In the case of thoughts expressed or entertained using proper names, the justification rests on testimony (we often rely on other people, or a chain of reference, when fixing the value of a tokened proper name), while in the case of descriptive names (e.g. 'Jack the Ripper'), i.e., singular terms introduced by stipulation, their understanding rests on knowledge of the stipulation. Reference and justification concern a body of beliefs and the way they are about a given object. In a nutshell, a body of beliefs is about an object o insofar as: (i) any belief in that body is about o and (ii) an agent is justified in taking them to be about o.

The second component of Dickie's theory (the need to represent things outside the mind) rests on our motivations and aims. This need, though, differs from an explicit intention, for it lacks conceptual or propositional content. For instance, one may need to feed oneself even if one lacks the concept of food, eating, etc. We share these kind of basic needs with other organisms. My cat needs to feed itself and acts accordingly even if it lacks the concepts of food, digestion, etc. Along this line Dickie stipulates that we need to represent things in the real world and argues that an agent can come to justifiably form beliefs guiding her actions based on this motivational need. As I understand it, this basic need can be seen as a biological given. An agent can come to gain skillful means toward the satisfaction of a motivational state, just as a cat can become more or less skillful in its chasing and catching mice. In other words, a subject S is justified in behaving in a way, W, if: (i) S needs to W, (ii) that need determines how S behaves and (iii) S is skilled in satisfying the need, so S's behavior is reliable toward S doing W. For instance: an archer is justified in shooting a target because the archer needs to hit the target, this need determines how the archer behaves, the archer's shooting is a reliable way to hit the target. While William Tell's shooting movements, given his skills, are strongly justified, my shooting movement, given my lack of skills, would be, at best, only weakly justified. Reasons guiding movements are justified when the agent is skillful, but less justified when she is less skillful.

The case of demonstrative identification, based on the need to represent objects in the real world, can be formulated as follows: (i) a subject S needs to represent things (outside the mind), (ii) that need determines that S forms a set of beliefs about the object o she identifies using 'that' in response to her perceptual encounter with o, (iii) S is skilled at representing external things, so S forming a body of 'that'-beliefs in response to her perceptual processing is a reliable means toward S representing external objects. S's beliefs about o that depend on her perceptual processing are strongly justified insofar as they are formed by S implementing a skillful strategy that reliably leads to the fulfillment of S's need to represent external objects. Yet, it may be that a justifiable notion of demonstrative (i.e., perception based) identification may require appeal to ceteris paribus conditions, i.e. to the fact that perception of an object occur under normal conditions (e.g., if we change the lighting a blue object may look violet, etc.). Besides, it would be interesting to see how the need to represent things outside the mind helps us to explain self-reference (I-thoughts) or the reference we would express using what David Kaplan characterizes as pure indexicals ('I', 'now', 'here', 'today', etc.) whose reference does not seem to rest on perceptual identification. For example, one does not need to perceive the present time when one expresses one's thought using 'now'. Be that as it may, Dickie's theory is plausible, cogent, and her arguments convincing. Finally, her thesis is well-informed by empirical research.

Given the space limitations, it is impossible to discuss all the subtleties of Dickie's rich proposal. In this last part I would merely like to highlight how Dickie's account -- and I take this to be its virtue -- can be understood as a hybrid between descriptivism and referentialism. That is, it encapsulates the virtues of both pictures while avoiding their well-known problems. In other words, Dickie's account incorporates the virtues of what came to be characterized as Frege's descriptivism on the one hand, and Millianism or direct reference on the other. This emerges in particular when Dickie discusses the variegated truth conditions that can be associated with an utterance (see 254 ff.) and how her proposal, based on reference and justification and the need to represent, supports this view.

According to the direct reference view, an utterance carrying a singular term (be it a proper name, an indexical expression, or a description used in the referential way) expresses a singular (or Russellian) proposition having the referent itself as a constituent. The constituent is the object the speaker thinks and talks about. To use Keith Donnellan's terminology, it is the object the thinker comes to have in mind.

As is well documented, this account faces difficulties dealing with the problems pertaining to cognitive significance highlighted by Frege. How is it that utterences like "Tully is an orator" and "Cicero is an orator" differ in cognitive value if they both express the very same proposition having the referent as a constituent? Propositions so understood cannot be the bearers of cognitive significance. But an utterance does not merely express a singular proposition. That is, the truth conditions of an utterance are not exhausted by the proposition expressed (intuitively, what is said or the Kaplanian content). A given utterance comprises many other truth conditions, i.e. the conditions it ought to fulfill for it to be true. Thus, in simplifying, if we consider an utterance of "I am happy", for it to be true it must fulfill the condition that the utterer (the agent) of it is happy. This is a proposition about the utterance itself. It gives us what John Perry characterizes as the reflexive truth conditions of the utterance. If one were to hear it without knowing who spoke it, one would at least grasp this proposition, i.e. that the speaker of it is happy. To grasp what is said, the hearer must identify the speaker and thus come to grasp the singular proposition expressed which has the speaker as a constituent. The same with an utterance of "Donald Trump is rich". The conditions it must fulfill in order to express a true proposition are something along these lines: "There is an x such that the speaker of this utterance refers to using 'Donald Trump' and x is rich". This is not what the speaker said. Yet it is what must be satisfied for the utterance to be true. Once we gradually fill in these (reflexive) truth conditions, we can reach the object-dependent truth conditions (or proposition) with Donald Trump himself as a constituent. The conditions an utterance must fulfill for it to be true are what help us to classify an utterance's cognitive value (and thus the speaker's mental state), while the object-dependent truth conditions (or singular proposition) are what determine the truth value of the utterance.

As I understand it, Dickie's proposal can be taken as a welcomed contribution to the picture inaugurated by Perry in 1988 (further discussed and developed by Perry 2011/12, Korta and Perry 2011, Corazza 2012). That is, as a contribution to the view that there is more to an utterance than its referential constituents. On this account, an utterance conveys variegated contents (truth conditions/propositions) that play different classificatory roles. Dickie's contribution should be viewed as a novel addition and enrichment to this relatively new trend.


Corazza E. 2012. "Same-Saying, Pluri-Propositionalism, and Implicatures". Mind and Language 27 (5): 546-69.

Korta K. and Perry J. 2011. Critical Pragmatics. Cambridge University Press.

Perry J. 1988. "Cognitive Significance and New Theories of Reference". Noûs 22 (1): 1-18.

Perry J. 2001/2012. Reference and Reflexivity. CSLI Publications.