Folk Psychological Narratives: The Sociocultural Basis of Understanding Reasons

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Daniel D. Hutto, Folk Psychological Narratives: The Sociocultural Basis of Understanding Reasons, MIT Press, 2008, 343pp., $38.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262083676.

Reviewed by Deborah Perron Tollefsen, University of Memphis


The ubiquitous use of folk psychological language and the fact that its use by children exhibits a stable pattern of development has convinced many that our "theory of mind" is a biological inheritance.  Indeed, this may be the only thing on which the standard offerings for understanding a theory of mind -- theory-theory and simulation theory -- are in agreement.  Folk Psychological Narratives challenges this received view and many other aspects of the current debate.  Hutto provides an extended argument for the view that our folk psychological capacities have a socio-cultural rather than biological basis.  The Narrative Practice Hypothesis (NPH) proposes that children only come to acquire a theory of mind by being exposed to and engaging in narrative practices.  As stated, the NPH is a developmental hypothesis about how we come to acquire a theory of mind.  But Hutto also offers us a hypothesis regarding the nature of a theory of mind.  A theory of mind, according to Hutto, essentially involves the ability to sensitively produce folk psychological narratives which explain and predict action in terms of reasons.  Folk psychology is just a special form of narrative practice.  He defends his developmental and conceptual hypotheses in chapters 1-7; spends a good deal of time undermining his competition in chapters 8-10; and provides a speculative discussion of the development of language and narrative practices in prehistoric peoples in chapters 11 and 12.

Understanding the NPH requires understanding what Hutto takes a theory of mind to be.  Empirical evidence strongly suggests that mental concepts are acquired by children in a piecemeal fashion, with an understanding of desire appearing early on and an understanding of belief appearing somewhere between the ages of three and four years.  The acquisition of the concept of belief is taken by many to be evidence of the existence of a "full-blown" theory of mind.  The debates concerning when and how children acquire a theory of mind have, therefore, focused almost exclusively on the notion of belief and have tended to characterize a theory of mind in terms of the ways in which children acquire the ability to explain and predict, from the third person point of view, the behavior of others.  There is also a general tendency to see a theory of mind as the basis for all social interactions.  Even the social interactions of infants are thought to reveal the rudiments of a theory of mind.

Hutto parts company with all of this.  He argues that having concepts of belief and desire is not yet to have a full-blown theory of mind; rather, a theory of mind involves being able to make sense of ourselves and others by appeal to reasons (intentions to act) where this requires the practical ability to understand propositional attitudes and the relations between them and an ability to apply a narrative framework in a sensitive manner -- adjusting for differences in context, history, and character.  He also argues that making sense of others is not done from the third person but from within the context of second person interactions.  Hutto argues that understanding others is not a "spectator sport" (p. 12).  Our predications and explanations of other's behavior are much more likely to be accurate if we get the story from "the horse's mouth."  It is through narratives, the stories people tell about why they did what they did, that we find explanations in terms of reasons.

This complex practical ability to use a narrative framework in a sensitive fashion is surely not had by young children and, according to Hutto, it is not necessary for most of our social interactions.  Hutto spends several chapters providing a defense of an embodied and enactive approach to perception, action, and coordination.  He argues that we have many other, more basic means of coordinating with one another in our social interactions.  Our primary modes of interpersonal engagement are not driven by prediction or abstract explanation; they are, rather, "more visceral; we get by with script-like patterns of recognition-response, some of which can be quite sophisticated and complex" (p. 3).  Even when social interactions do require acknowledgment of the intentional attitudes of others this need not presuppose a robust theory of mind.  In these cases the subject responds selectively to end-directed intentional attitudes that are expressed in behavior.  It is only when things go wrong that we make use of narratives involving the attribution of belief and desire.  That is, many of our everyday interactions with others do not involve attributing propositional attitudes.  Hutto provides both an ontogenetic and phylogenetic story about how we have acquired concepts of belief and desire, the basic building blocks of the narrative framework.  It is only through the engagement with narratives, however, that we acquire a robust theory of mind.

Susan Hurley, one of the advocates of an enactive and embodied approach to action and perception, once accused philosophers of mind and psychology of "over intellectualizing the mind."  Hutto is clearly not guilty of this.  He provides a detailed theory of a non-cognitivist and non-representational understanding of intentionality.  He argues that our basic intentional directedness can be understood in biosemiotic (rather than biosemantic) terms.  Embodied and enactive modes of responding to others form the basis of all of our interactions.  These need not involve the acquisition or manipulation of encoded informational content.  It is only when we achieve mastery of linguistic constructions and practices that we gain understanding of propositional attitudes and acquire, through interaction with narratives, a robust theory of mind.  Hutto, therefore, falls in line with Donald Davidson and others who have argued that language is necessary for representational thought and the meta-representational abilities required for making sense of others.

I am extremely sympathetic to the minimalist view of the mind Hutto develops and excited to see such a thorough development of this alternative.  I am less convinced by the developmental story Hutto tells, however, and this is, in part, because the details seem to be missing.  What exactly does a child acquire from listening to narratives and what sorts of narratives does Hutto think are crucial for acquiring a theory of mind?  We are told that what is unique about a theory of mind is its ability to make sense of others in terms of reasons (not simply the ability to attribute beliefs and desires).  Such an understanding is given through engagement with "people narratives."  Narratives present what happened and what a person did in a way that allows an audience to make sense of the thoughts, feelings, and actions of the characters.  Narratives offer exemplars.  They contain the norms and forms -- the basic rules of folk psychology--and they exhibit these principles in action.  Hutto appeals to folk tales such as "Little Red Riding Hood" as having all of the proper structure to introduce children to how folk psychology works.  He also notes that caretakers normally engage children when reading these narratives.  Narratives are the object of episodes of joint attention.  Caretakers ask children questions about the characters' behaviors (Why do you think he did that?).  This allows children to gain facility with the giving and taking of reasons.  Narratives are both exemplars and tools used to teach children how to become good folk psychologists.

This all sounds good but what evidence do we have for thinking that young children find themselves in environments full of narratives and good caretakers willing to engage them in discussion of such narratives?  Hutto thinks it is obvious that our own culture is steeped in narratives, though he admits that he has "no precise data on how many of these stories children encounter in the normal course of their development" (p. 30).  He also seems to assume that most children are in an ideal child rearing environment -- call this the Reggio-Emilia Assumption (in reference to the amazing preschool programs developed in the Reggio-Emilia region of Italy). 

All NPH requires for its credibility is the assumption that the child's world is adequately populated with responsive caregivers who relate folk psychological narratives and that children are given enough opportunities to participate with these narratives in storytelling practices of the right kind.  This seems to be the case, in most cultures.  (p. 186) 

This is a substantial empirical claim and I am doubtful that what Hutto describes is the norm.  Data on literacy rates and reading in the home, at least in the United States, suggests that children interact very little with texts and, sadly, even less with good caretakers.  Hutto does acknowledge that proficiency with narrative practices can come from television, comics, radio, and verbal conversation.  Perhaps this is where the economically and socially disadvantaged child receives his or her narrative training.  But are such narratives of the right sort?  Since Hutto believes a large role is played by the caregiver in engaging the child, it is difficult to see how children, many of whom sit passively before the television for hours at a time, are able to acquire proficiency in this narrative practice.

To be fair, Hutto's theory allows for the fact that there will be differences both in the acquisition of a theory of mind and in narrative practices across cultures.  In cultures where there is less story telling or story telling of a different sort, the theory of mind will differ or be less robust.  Thus, Hutto denies the universal convergence assumption fueling much of the nativist thinking about these matters.  Perhaps then there are differences within cultures?  Inner city children with little or no access to good childcare may be deficient in a theory of mind?  Hutto doesn't seem to think so. 

In most Western societies, even the character of storytelling practices, parenting styles, and schooling patterns is alike.  Where such tight intracultural convergences exist with respect to narrative practices, we can expect to find a similar level of explanatory proficiency and tendencies.  (p. 190) 

Again, whether storytelling practices are similar within Western cultures is an empirical hypothesis, one for which Hutto provides no evidence.  Perhaps, his theory opens the door for research that explores the impact of narratives on the development of children within different socio-economic classes within Western society.  But since, as he himself notes, the credibility of his theory rests on a substantially idealized view of how children grow up in Western society it is difficult to motivate the theory to begin with.  I wish I was as optimistic as he is that most children have responsive caretakers who read to them on a regular basis and interact with them in deep and meaningful ways concerning reasons, feelings, and actions.

But even if I was optimistic about the way children are cared for in Western societies, Hutto's theory doesn't tell us much about the nature of the narratives that are so crucial to the development of a theory of mind.  He repeatedly remarks that the narratives must be of the "right sort."  But we aren't told what this "sort" is or given any examples of the wrong sort of narratives.  He mentions folk tales as being paradigmatic narratives involving reference to reasons for actions but a cursory look at my children's book shelf suggests that the stories don't involve any explicit discussion of a character's reasons.  We don't find locutions such as "Curious George went to the pizza place because the man with the yellow hat asked him to get the pizza" or "The reason George climbed the tree is …"  There is, of course, the reference to George being curious and this may be understood mentalistically.  But there is no explicit discussion of his curiosity being a reason for his behavior, nor do children's stories use the term "belief" or "thought" or "desire" very often.  Aside from explicit references to emotions ("George was scared"), mentalistic vocabulary is fairly minimal in children's stories or so at least my cursory search suggests.  Children's stories are about what characters do and only implicitly about why they do it.

Now, Hutto obviously doesn't think that narratives make explicit reference to reasons or that they explicitly lay out the principles and forms of folk psychology.  There is something about narratives which somehow implicitly embeds the notion of a reason and its appropriate context, and somehow children pick up on this when they are exposed to narratives.  But how does this work?  How does the child move from "George did that … and then this" to "He did that because he thought this and because he wanted this …"?  Presumably the caretaker plays a role here by asking the child "Why did George … ?" and by correcting the child when she provides the "wrong" explanation.  But then it is not the narrative itself which provides the child with the concept of a reason and the principles of folk psychology, but the caretaker.  This doesn't undermine Hutto's major thesis that a theory of mind has a socio-cultural basis, but it does suggest that narratives (at least the sort young children confront in books around the age of 3-4) are not the catalyst for a robust theory of mind.  Social interactions with people, not texts, are the basis for a theory of mind.

Finally, I wonder whether Hutto's characterization of a theory of mind in terms of a narrative practice isn't guilty of simply changing the subject.  He seems to simply redefine what a theory of mind is.  He won't like this way of characterizing what he is up to.  He believes the narrative understanding of a theory of mind is the natural understanding of it.  My characterization here isn't meant to be a disagreement with him necessarily.  It is meant to note a subtle shift in the conversation.  To define a theory of mind in terms of the ability to provide rich psychological narratives is to shift the focus to a much richer ability than merely understanding and attributing belief.  Nativists might be able to accept that our narrative psychological practices are indeed socio-cultural, while our theory of mind, defined solely in terms of our understanding and application of concepts such as belief and desire, is biologically based.  Given Hutto's biosemiotic conception of intentionality he too seems to agree that the basic elements of a theory of mind are biologically based.  It isn't clear to me then that, with respect to the role of narratives, Hutto and his competitors are necessarily at odds.

Nothing I have said here detracts from the fact that Hutto has provided a substantial and compelling theory.  He provides thorough and convincing criticisms of nativist theories of mind and opens up new lines of empirical research regarding the role of narratives in both the ontogeny and phylogeny.  Folk Psychological Narratives should be read by all psychologists and philosophers interested in a theory of mind.