Following the Rules: Practical Reasoning and Deontic Constraint

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Joseph Heath, Following the Rules: Practical Reasoning and Deontic Constraint, Oxford University Press, 2008, 344pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195370294.

Reviewed by Joseph Mendola, University of Nebraska-Lincoln


In Following the Rules, Joseph Heath sketches a model of moral motivation, and indeed of practical rationality in general. He situates his account of how it is rational to obey deontic moral constraints -- by which he means moral rules in the rough style of Kant -- inside of an account of what he takes to be the more general phenomenon of how it is rational to obey social norms of all sorts. He holds that moral rules are a subset of the social norms we accept, the 'rules we follow'. These are taken to include not only rules of morality and etiquette, but also norms of epistemic rationality and reasoning. He provides a general account of 'following the rules' in this very broad sense.

Heath's account postulates a 'normative control system' in humans, which he models as a meta-preference, a higher-order preference that assigns reasons for action that arise from social norms a certain weight in making decisions, a weight that can overbalance reasons that arise from first-order preferences like desires for apples and oranges. This proposal is motivated as an attempt to answer two difficulties that arise for traditional decision theory -- conceived as a theory of instrumental rationality in the guise of individual utility maximization -- when it is applied to social contexts. The first is a problem of indeterminacy that occurs when individual utility maximizers face situations in which each of their decisions depends on what other people will do. It is a problem of coordination. The second problem occurs when individual utility maximizers face situations like the Prisoner's Dilemma, in which if all act individually so as to maximize utility then all will lose relative to an outcome available by more cooperative behavior. This is a cooperation problem. Heath argues that various 'instrumental approaches' to these two problems, which appeal to punishment of offenders, special motives like altruism, states of long-range planning, or conventions in the sense of David Lewis, fail, and that experimental game theory provides positive reason to favor his new alternative.

A second important element of Heath's proposal is a novel account of what intentional psychological states in general are, including beliefs and desires as well as the acceptance of the normative principles to which one's normative control system commits one. It is also a novel account of the subject matter to which the proper rational decision theory -- and hence the proper model of practical rationality -- applies. Building on Robert Brandom's roughly Sellarsian conception of assertion, Heath claims that intentional states like beliefs, desires, and accepting principles are all essentially internalized language, where language is essentially public; and he more specifically claims that they are positions in the game of giving and asking for reasons. Such states are essentially Brandomian 'deontic statuses' in such games, and hence involve various commitments. Heath holds that decision theory is a way to make explicit the commitments implicit in these deontic statuses. This conception implies that, for instance, desires in Heath's sense are a very fancy sort of state, unavailable to those incapable of language and indeed of very fancy activities involving language. But of course even such fancy desires might be sensitive to various urges and feels, urges and feels that play a role in 'language-entry rules' for such 'moves' of a roughly Sellarsian sort. Heath contrasts his proposal with what he calls 'preference noncognitivism', which is the view that our desires are given and also outside of rational control. He also contrasts his account with Brandom's only somewhat similar proposal, and with accounts that postulate intentions as distinct psychological states.

Heath supports his two-part proposal by a discussion of work in evolutionary biology. In particular, Heath argues that the 'ultrasociality' of humans is fundamentally dependent on a norm-conformative disposition, which includes a tendency to imitative conformity and a tendency to moralistic punishment of defectors from imitative conformity. We are monkeys who do what others around us do, and who also punish, even at some cost to ourselves, those who fail to so conform. Heath thinks that this norm-conformative disposition underlies and explains the emergence of propositionally-significant language. He also thinks that it therefore underlies and explains the origins of mental content in internalized speech, and finally our intentional planning capacities, which he takes to be the principal root of greater human intelligence. Moral motives like reciprocity and altruism also rest, according to Heath, on conformity to specific sorts of social norms. The norm-conformative disposition is a kind of hidden key to many specifically human capacities, and it is a single phenomenon, he thinks. Even though there may be evolutionary pressure against the forms of reciprocity and sympathetic altruism that humans sometimes exhibit, such attitudes come in a single package with norm conformity of all sorts, for which there are supposed to be significant evolutionary advantages.

Heath puts his account to work against the 'motivational skeptic' about morality, who entertains the possibility that someone might judge an action to be right and yet fail to have any motive to perform it, and hence becomes skeptical about the rationality for some of morality. Heath deploys a kind of transcendental argument against the motivational skeptic. Any even very selfish person who can ask the question whether it is rational to be moral is norm-conformative. Rational consideration itself requires that. And so there can be no question of any rational cognizer throwing off the general sort of rule-following of which morality is an instance.

This argument may seem to overlook the widespread acknowledgment that there is weakness of will, the widespread observation that one can accept that some action is rationally required -- either by possessing moral deontic status that one recognizes or rational status of some other sort -- and yet not perform the action. It seems that there are people, for instance me, who sometimes judge that all things considered they ought rationally to X, and then fail to do it. Heath claims however that weakness of the will of this sort isn't a philosophical problem but rather a social control phenomenon, analogous to 'out of control' impulsive behavior. As in impulsive behavior, one is not really an agent in such a case. Still, it may seem that we sometimes even act intentionally against our best judgment. But Heath denies this, and propounds alternative explanations for cases that may seem to be of this sort. These alternative explanations involve forms of discounting future preference satisfaction, which can be modeled by meta-preferences analogous to that by which Heath models the normative control system. In particular, Heath favors a model involving hyperbolic discounting that has been developed by George Ainslie, whereby we discount satisfaction much more sharply in the very short term. Heath further suggests that many familiar strategies of self-control are often rational strategies properly adopted by hyperbolic discounters to control the dynamic instabilities in their preferences and behaviors that result from hyperbolic discounting. He also proposes various external strategies of self-control, deploying various environmental conditions, that haven't been the focus of much attention by philosophers. This is what he calls 'volitional prosthetics'.

Even if Heath can answer the motivational skeptic about morality, that still leaves the question of whether there might be people who accept merely norms of rationality and eschew traditional moral norms. In fact, Heath's strategy for answering the motivational skeptic, by imbedding the phenomenon of moral motivation inside of our acceptance of norms in general, to at least some of which all rational cognizers are supposed to be committed, makes this problem even more central and dramatic. But Heath proposes that the modern philosophical anxiety about moral norms in particular, dating at least back to Hobbes, is mistaken in this sense: Morality is a vast cultural artifact of norms. Elements of morality are supposed by Heath to be taken for granted in all sorts of social interactions and intellectual operations, even those in which their presence may not be obvious to us. There can be no standing outside of morality for us. Rather at most we can hope through piecemeal reconsideration -- a la Neurath -- to slowly rebuild our moral boat, a single plank at a time. Even those who propose simplifying and hence radicalizing reductions of morality to what is more morally fundamental -- of the sort developed by utilitarians or contractarians or Kantians -- are in fact engaging in this sort of internal criticism, according to Heath. When morality is criticized, it is always from within. What's more, Heath claims that his account shows that there is no reason to have any ontological anxiety about what proper morality or moral truth requires. Social norms are, he says, the ontological correlate of moral judgments. He says that moral judgments are about the rules that govern our interactions.

As is inevitable for any philosophical reader of any novel philosophical book with ambition and sweep, I disagree with much of this. I don't find that my ontological anxiety about moral truth has gone away after considering Heath's model of moral motivation. It doesn't seem plausible to me that our moral judgments are about the social norms that govern our interactions. I believe that there are at least beliefs and desires even in animals incapable of making moves in games of giving and asking for reasons in language. I think that even humans have many desires that aren't quite so fancy as Heath suggests. I think that there are cases when we act even intentionally against our best judgment about what rationality requires. It seems to me that I've known people who are committed to principles of theoretical rationality but not to the core of any morality worthy of the name. I also think that if Heath is confident that the norm-conformative disposition can be prior to language and hence to fancy linguistically-mediated intentional states like belief and desire in his sense, then he should also be confident that something like the acceptance of moral rules can be similarly prior, which doesn't seem consistent with what he says when he introduces us to rule following.

But none of this undercuts the value of the book. Following the Rules brings together in a provocative and interesting way various literatures that moral philosophers should consider. It makes many novel proposals worth some thought. And it propounds as a basic moral motive something no more edifying and ennobling than a tendency to conform and punish non-conformers. It seems to me that this proposal deserves serious contemporary consideration. I think that this is an excellent book.