For Foucault: Against Normative Political Theory,

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Mark G. E. Kelly, For Foucault: Against Normative Political Theory, State University of New York Press, 2018, 202pp., $80.00, ISBN 9781438467610.

Reviewed by Frieder Vogelmann, Bremen University


Mark Kelly's book is original, thought-provoking and at times infuriating. Its originality lies in Kelly's overall thesis that political thinking should follow Michel Foucault's model of a strictly non-normative critique. It is thought-provoking because Kelly combines his thesis with sharp criticism against all forms of normative political theory, be they (Rawlsian) analytic political philosophy or critical theory. Yet the book is infuriating because Kelly sometimes deliberately refuses to argue for his far-reaching claims.

Kelly sets the scene in his introduction with the stark opposition between normative political theory and Foucault's non-normative critique, understanding "normativity" as a synonym for "prescription." Political theory is normative if (and only if) it tells us what to do and how to think, in other words, if (and only if) it advocates norms. Foucault's political thought abstains from doing so -- at least in Kelly's interpretation -- and instead "simply . . . analyze[s] things in order to undermine them." (9) In fact, Kelly reads Foucault's work as being neither normative nor political theory: Foucault refuses systematization, hence is "atheoretical" (11), and Foucault refuses to do politics, at least in the sense of "'party politics' and statecraft." (12)

Kelly's interpretation thus opposes Foucault literally against (all three concepts that make up) normative political theory, but he gives his readers only its barest outlines (148-150; more can be found in Kelly 2009; 2014). Instead of discussing the quite original combination of a non-normative, atheoretical and un-political critique, Kelly presents exegetical evidence against recent interpretations that turn Foucault into a normative political theorist (e.g. by Patton 2010; 2014) or into a supporter of neoliberalism (see the essays in Zamora and Behrent 2016 [2014]). Yet even if we agree to interpret Foucault's critique as non-normative because it does not prescribe what to do, think or be instead of describing what we do, think and are today, Foucault very systematically sets up his conceptual apparatus to produce this diagnosis. There is a surprisingly consistent series of short self-interpretations in all of Foucault's lectures at the Collège de France from 1970 to 1984 (as well as in some of his books and talks) in which he presents his methodology for analyzing practices along the three axes of knowledge, power and relation to self (e.g. Foucault 2010 [2008]: 2-6; see Vogelmann 2017). Kelly, of course, knows this (Kelly 2009: 78-82); hence his deliberate choice not to discuss his interpretation of Foucault's non-normative, atheoretical and un-political critique, which is after all what this book advocates, is regrettable, as it weakens the book's persuasive power.

Why should we prefer Foucault's non-normative critique to normative political theory? Kelly gives us three reasons: First, normative political theory is inherently dangerous, Kelly says, for normative theories lend themselves more readily to abuse than does strictly negative criticism. (7f.) Second, we have no positive reason to engage in normative political theory but a pragmatic reason against doing so, because normative statements in political theory limit the audience to those sharing these normative ideals. Third, normative political theory is blind to its unintended consequences because it presupposes that "propounding a normative theory is eo ipso a contribution to realizing its normative vision." (8) Yet if this close connection between theory and practice is not a given, as Kelly argues, then believing in it diverts attention from the effects these theories really have (if they have any at all).

Kelly develops his overall claim in chapters 1-7 by looking at a select group of political theorists -- Marx, Lenin, Althusser, Deleuze, Rorty, Honneth and Geuss -- who offer alternatives to normative political theory, yet fall short of Foucault's model of non-normative critique, to which Kelly turns in chapter 8 before his conclusion. The basic storyline starts with Marx, who revolutionized political thought by providing an almost completely non-normative critique -- "almost" because of his theoretical ambitions. All other theorists are assessed in how far they improve on Marx and what still separates them from Foucault. Here, I can only summarize Kelly's often original and insightful discussion and show how he develops his overarching claims, to which I will return in the end.

In chapter 1, Kelly argues against interpretations of Marxism "as a perspective within post-Rawlsian 'political philosophy,' understanding it therefore as a normative enterprise, providing a prescriptive theory of social organization, closely related to or synonymous with normative ethics." (22) Since this has been done mostly by arguing that Marx' critical concepts express a normative stance, Kelly aims to demonstrate that Marx' usage of concepts like "alienation," "exploitation," "slavery," and "theft" is purely descriptive. "Alienation," for example, simply describes the fact that human potential is limited by a social system, Kelly agues, which meets opposition from those who are not content with these limits. No prescriptive sense of "alienation" is needed to account for Marx' usage of it.

Kelly's systematic point is that normative interpretations of Marx mostly set out from the premise that critique presupposes a normative stance. Since Marx criticizes capitalism, they deduce that he must have a normative basis, and then they look at supposedly normative concepts for evidence. Kelly's reply is worth quoting in full, as it exemplifies his discursive style:

I don't accept this premise: I believe antipathy for capitalism need not to be normative, but can simply reflect a non-normative preference. I might not like having my house flooded, might wish it would stop flooding, might analyze the reason it is flooding, and even perhaps engage in political action aimed at getting the state to provide better flood defenses. In order to take systematic action against flooding, I would have to enlist other people to my cause, but this requires only that other people share my preference. None of this implies a normative assessment of flooding as morally bad or positive normative assessment of flood defenses as a moral good. (25f.)

Disposing similarly of interpretations that detect a normative stance in Marx' concepts of "exploitation," "slavery," and "theft," Kelly ends the chapter by charging Marx with not being non-normative enough because he still propounds a political theory. However, one can do only so, according to Kelly, by relying on normative presuppositions. (36)

Whereas Kelly argues that Lenin's political thought "is a classic example of normative political theory in action, with a utopian vision covering reality" (57) and therefore turning into an authoritarian political practice (chapter 2), Althusser holds on to the non-normativity of Marx' critique (chapter 3). He shares Foucault's anti-humanism, but his theoretical ambitions and his strategic decision to stay in the French Communist Party resulted in a type of political thought very different from Foucault's: a dogmatic philosophy (see Althusser 1990: 74) that clings to Marx's texts and concepts while creatively re-interpreting them, sometimes beyond recognition (Kelly's example is Althusser's interpretation of the base-superstructure-metaphor: see 67f.). Althusser takes us one step beyond Marx but again "commits to a kind of normativity, which resides in his being theoretical and political." (72)

In contrast, Gilles Deleuze's thought is a "thoroughly retrograde step in relation to normativity and theoretization" (92), Kelly argues in chapter 4, because Deleuze turns into norms the very insights that he shares with Foucault, especially the "end of the sovereign subject" (92). The chapter is mostly devoted to a detailed (and rather uncharitable) reading of Deleuze's "Postscript on the Societies of Control" (1992 [1990]), according to which Deleuze misinterprets Foucault's concept of discipline, therefore mistakes certain phenomena as evidence for a new technology of power, and thus presents an inaccurate diagnosis of the present (76-91). Kelly's reason for targeting this small essay rather than Deleuze's other works is that it has been quite influential and that Foucauldian scholarship has tended to not to refute but to affirm Deleuze's arguments -- a grave mistake, in Kelly's perspective.

In chapter 5, Kelly defends Foucault against Richard Rorty's accusation that Foucault elevates his personal political preferences into philosophical truths and instead blames Rorty for doing just that.  According to Kelly, Rorty's enthusiastic support for political liberalism is not vindicated by his diagnosis that liberalism is the only paradigm left for political theory after the collapse of the USSR. Even if one accepted this questionable version of the "end of history," no normative endorsement would follow, Kelly argues; one could, with Foucault, "contextualize and detach from one's prejudices through historical studies that show their contingency". (108)

Axel Honneth's critique of Foucault as providing a "functionalist" theory of society prompts further defense from Kelly in chapter 6. According to Kelly, Foucault merely "proposes  . . .  'ongoing conceptualizations'" (115, the quote is from Foucault 1998 [1982]: 327) but, unlike Honneth, does not attempt to provide a theory of society. The decisive difference concerns the task of political theorists: Honneth presupposes that critics and social movements must advance normative claims. Therefore, the task of intellectuals must be to give them a vocabulary in which they understand, articulate and justify their experiences and their aims (Honneth 1996 [1992]). Foucault, Kelly argues, has a very different idea: "by remaining resolutely critical Foucault hopes to avoid serving any particular positive agenda." (122)

With regard to the overarching plot of the book, Rorty and Honneth are even further away from Foucault's model than Deleuze, Althusser, Lenin or Marx -- and Raymond Geuss, whose position Kelly considers in chapter 7. Although he sees a lot of merit in Geuss' attack on Rawlsian political theory, Kelly charges Geuss with being too normative because Geuss holds, with Nietzsche, that making evaluations about values is necessary in politics as well as in political thought. Kelly instead argues that it is possible to abstain from value evaluations in political thought and that it is advantageous to do so in order to maximize one's potential audience (135f.). Furthermore, Geuss is insufficiently critical of philosophy, since his attack is only directly against analytical philosophy (which Kelly sees as a strategical mistake: see 140), and because Geuss' political realism still allows for advocating positive policies. Yet any policy recommendation that is not a recommendation to abolish something is too dangerous because of its unintended side effects, Kelly argues. Non-normative undermining critique is all political thinkers should do.

A rather austere practice of political thought emerges from Kelly's arguments against normative political theory: It appears to be confined to a descriptive analysis, "grey" because it tries to use as little colorful evaluation as possible (see 136) and deliberately far from political practice, as any direct involvement risks cooptation by the strategies of power. It strikes me as an unnecessarily bleak vision of non-normative political thought. Worse, advocating non-normative critique because it is "safe" from becoming involved in politics amounts exactly to the position of "so-called left parties" that Foucault scorns in an interview because they enjoy failure:

As soon as something is successful and becomes reality, they decry that is has been co-opted by the established system. They position themselves in such a way that they cannot be coopted; in other words, that their failure is inevitable. . . . In the end, one does everything in order to never succeed. (Foucault 2001 [1978]: 529 f., translation F.V.)

However, the real disservice Kelly does to his interesting conception of non-normative critique and to others working against normative political theory lies in his mode of presenting it. His original thesis and thought-provoking criticisms evoke far-reaching claims in all three conceptual dimensions of normative political theory, yet they are never treated with the argumentative attention they deserve -- and sometimes require.

Normativity. Even if one shares Kelly's suspicion against the claim that critique must be normative, brushing it aside is unconvincing and strategically misguided. Kelly's argument against the necessity of normative critique (in the chapter on Marx) depends on his understanding of normativity as explicit prescription.[1] Yet most of those who hold that critique is necessarily normative would argue that any critique expresses dissatisfaction with whatever is criticized; that we can ask critics about the reasons why they are dissatisfied; and that these reasons will inevitably speak for another state of affairs. To that extent, they have, express or even are (depending on your theory of normativity) a normative force.

My point in repeating this well-known argument is not to advocate it but to be clear about what Kelly would have to face. Merely stipulating an alternative understanding is strategically as mistaken as Kelly claims including normative statements into political thought is, for in both cases, one fails to address the audience who is not yet convinced by one's own position. Reducing the alternative understanding to a caricature -- as "hopelessly inflationary, making the normative coextensive with subjectivity" (2) -- is especially unhelpful in this regard, since Kelly cannot presume that his readers share his own understanding (as he is well aware: viii). I would find it more promising if Kelly heeded his own advice and criticized the wide-spread understanding of normativity in order to undermine it. Some of the required conceptual tools are already available: for example, Frederick Beiser (2009) provides a partial history of the current normativism that is well suited to undermine it, and Kelly's own account of, say, Althusser's theoretical anti-humanism or Geuss' defense of negative criticism might be used to advance further criticisms of the hegemonic understanding of "normativity". So why merely oppose one definition to another?

Theory. Maybe Kelly thinks that developing the understanding of normativity in enough detail to successfully undermine it is already too theoretical an approach. However, he never explains why he holds that doing theory implies being normative. I have already hinted at the possibility that Foucault might not be as "atheoretical" as Kelly takes him to be, yet the systematic point seems more relevant to me: Why does Kelly think it is impossible to create a non-normative theory, especially given his narrow understanding of normativity? To put the point polemically: would not a "happy" positivistic understanding of science fit the bill?

Politics. The most decisive question for Kelly's approach is what kind of political thought he recommends. As we have seen, he claims that the only task for political theorists is to analyze the present using Foucault's undermining critique in order to stand up against power. According to Kelly, this is no normative claim: "neither Foucault nor I argue for a valorization of resistance per se." (124) Resistance is not "good" and power is not "bad"; both are normatively ambiguous. Thus, it seems as if there is no meaningful difference between power and resistance: resistance simply is counter-power. Yet Kelly holds on to some kind of difference when he states:

Now, for resistance to succeed in practice, it must coalesce into some kind of movement, that itself has power, specifically counter-power, power opposed to other power, and which therefore itself encounters resistance. Hence, if social movements do require norms, this may be said to be required to the extent that they have power relations with them, and are not purely resistant. (124)

This is puzzling, for why would resistance not need norms if power does -- unless Kelly does in fact make a normative distinction? What distinguishes power from resistance such that the latter is not in need of a norm?

In any case, siding with a specific resistance against power seems to be a personal choice for Kelly. That does not make it voluntarist, as he can give reasons for his choice, and these reasons do not have to prescribe what others should do. Thus, Kelly's case for Foucault's model of non-normative critique against normative political theory rests on his non-prescriptive reasons for it, and we are have come back to the three reasons given in the introduction: normative political theory is more easily abused than non-normative critique, is less inclusive for audiences with pluralistic normative stances, and is blind to its practical effects.

The problem is that the book does not develop these reasons sufficiently so that they could bear the weight we now see they need to bear. I have already argued that Kelly's austere conception of non-normative critique seems safe from abuse only because it is not supposed to have any practical effects at all. I have also argued that Kelly's way of presenting what he takes to be Foucault's model of political thought does not seem more inviting to audiences who do not already share his preference than including normative statements. Finally, how are we to compare how easily a theory can be abused? How do we even judge what "easy" in his regard means, let alone "abuse"? The debate on Marx' political thought and its "realizations" hardly gives us hope to be able to do so.

In sum, Kelly's book is a missed chance. His original interpretation of Foucault's non-normative, atheoretical and un-political critique as well as his sharp criticisms against normative political theory certainly are promising. Yet they are not sufficiently argued for, and to the extent that this is a deliberate choice, Kelly's book is infuriating. For sympathizers with Foucault's model of non-normative critique, the challenge still stands to emancipate those who are enthralled by normative political theory.


I would like to thank Christina Müller for her corrections.


Althusser, Louis (1990): Philosophy and the spontaneous philosophy of the scientists and other essays. Gregory Elliot )ed.). Verso.

Beiser, Frederick C. (2009): Normativity in Neo-Kantianism. Its Rise and Fall. In: International Journal of Philosophical Studies 17 (1), 9-27.

Deleuze, Gilles (1992 [1990]): Postscript on the Societies of Control. In: October 59, 3-7.

Foucault, Michel (1998 [1982]): The Subject and Power. In: J. Faubion (ed.), Power: Essential Works of Michel Foucault 1954-1984, Vol. III. The New Press, 326-348.

--  --  -- (2001 [1978]): Sexualité et politique (n°230) Dits et Écrits II. 1976-1988. Daniel Defert, François Ewald and Jaques Lagrange (eds.). Gallimard.

--  --  -- (2010 [2008]): The Government of Self and Others. Lectures at the Collège de France 1982-1983. Graham Burchell (tr.). Frédéric Gros (ed.). Basingstoke: Palgrave Macmillan.

Honneth, Axel (1996 [1992]): The Struggle for Recognition. The Moral Grammar of Social Conflicts. MIT Press.

Kelly, Mark G. E. (2009): The Political Philosophy of Michel Foucault. Routledge.

--  --  -- (2014): Foucault and Politics. A Critical Introduction. Edinburgh University Press.

Patton, Paul (2010): Foucault and Normative Political Philosophy. Liberal and Neo-Liberal Governmentality and Public Reasonc. In: Timothy O'Leary and Christopher Falzon (ed.), Foucault and Philosophy. Chichester: Wiley-Blackwell, 204-221.

--  --  -- (2014): Foucault and Rawls. Government and Public Reason. In: Vanessa Lemm and Miguel Vatter (ed.), The Government of Life. Foucault Biopolitics, and Neoliberalism. Fordham University Press, 141-162.

Vogelmann, Frieder (2017): Critique as a Practice of Prefigurative Emancipation. In: Distinktion 18 (2), 196-214.

Zamora, Daniel and Michael C. Behrent (eds.) (2016 [2014]): Foucault and Neoliberalism. Polity Press.

[1] Kelly sometimes goes one step further and identifies normativity and morality, for example in the quote from chapter 2 on Marx above (25f.). Defenders of normative political theory will have an easy time pointing out that norms are not always moral norms and therefore normativity is not identical to morality. Yet I will grant Kelly that his arguments do not presuppose this identification.