For the Love of Metaphysics: Nihilism and the Conflict of Reason from Kant to Rosenzweig

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Karin Nisenbaum, For the Love of Metaphysics: Nihilism and the Conflict of Reason from Kant to Rosenzweig, Oxford University Press, 2018, 280pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190680640.

Reviewed by Peter Thielke, Pomona College


While nihilist attitudes have always lurked in the dark corners of philosophy, the term 'nihilism' did not enter the lexicon until the 1780s, when it was coined by the German philosopher F.H. Jacobi to describe what he saw as the inevitable descent of rationalism into a denial of the world. That might seem like an obscure and musty historical curiosity, but Karin Nisenbaum, in her excellent book, makes the provocative -- and compelling -- case that Jacobi's nihilist challenge both informs much of the path of German Idealism and remains a pressing concern for contemporary philosophy. Beginning with Jacobi and the 'rational skepticism' of Jacobi's contemporary Salomon Maimon, Nisembaum explores the ways in which Kant, Fichte, Schelling and Rosenzweig attempt to respond to, and overcome, the nihilistic threat that Jacobi first identified. In doing so, Nisenbaum charts a new and fascinating path for traversing the landscape of German Idealism, one that both attempts to preserve the project of metaphysics from skeptical attack, and also seeks to connect the concerns of Idealism to contemporary debates. It is an ambitious work, but Nisenbaum delivers an engaging, compelling and lucid account of the ways in which responding to the nihilistic threat leads to what might be called, following Rosenzweig, the redemption of philosophy.

While the book is a work in the history of philosophy, it must be noted that it is far more thematic than many other monographs in the field. Nisenbaum discusses a number of philosophers, but the book does not aim to provide exhaustive accounts of any of the thinkers' systematic views; the focus is squarely on the ways in which Kant, Fichte, and particularly Schelling and Rosenzweig can be seen as contributing to the defense of metaphysics against nihilism, rather than on their broader philosophical projects. To this end, Nisenbaum engages not only with the primary texts of the German Idealists, but with the extensive secondary literature that has developed around these figures, as well as with contemporary thinkers. At times, Nisenbaum perhaps relies too heavily on these commentators, rather than drawing her points directly from the works of the Idealists themselves, but this reservation is largely mitigated by the ways in which her engagement with the various interpretations of Idealism allow her to forge fascinating connections to contemporary issues and debates.

The book begins with a discussion of Kant's transcendental idealism, and in particular what Nisenbaum calls the 'conflict of reason,' which involves a question about whether our cognitive faculties -- both theoretical and practical -- can engage in their distinctive activity when we cannot be certain that the conditions under which this is possible actually obtain. For Kant, this conflict of reason turns on the status of the unconditioned in our cognition, and his solution to it comes only with the practical use of reason: we are entitled to make "objective (metaphysical claims) based on practical reason's demand for the unconditioned, but not based on theoretical reason's demand for the unconditioned" (10). The arc of German Idealism, from Fichte to Schelling to Rosenzweig, Nisenbaum claims, can be seen as a response to Kant's proposed solution to the conflict of reason, both in a recognition of the promise of Kant's emphasis on practical reason, but also a dissatisfaction with the divide that Kant establishes between practical and theoretical cognition. The aim of her work is to

show that the development of post-Kantian German Idealism is propelled by the different interpretations, appropriations, and radicalizations of the Kantian view that the representation of the unconditioned (or absolute) by finite beings is a topic of practical, not theoretical, philosophy. (11)

The book is composed of three parts, one outlining the challenges to metaphysics raised by Jacobi and Maimon, a second on the ways in which the early works of Fichte and Schelling 'radicalized' Kant's primacy of the practical, and a final part devoted to Schelling's and Rosenzweig's attempts to affirm the world in the face of the threat of nihilism. While Nisenbaum's argument is rich and complex, it is presented in a clear and engaging fashion, and the chapters progress in a natural manner that culminates in the discussion of Rosenzweig as the heir to Schelling's strand of German Idealism.

Both Jacobi and Maimon are little known today, but it is hard to overstate their importance to the development of post-Kantian philosophy. Each contributes a distinctive challenge to the project of metaphysics, and together serve as the impetus for Nisenbaum's reconstruction of German Idealism. Jacobi famously argues that any commitment to the Principle of Sufficient Reason leads invariably to nihilism and fatalism, since only Spinoza's system -- which Jacobi sees as nihilistic -- is consistent with the demands of reason. The Spinozistic All reduces to a One that is Nothing, and the "attempt to reconstruct reflectively and explain the origin of the world inevitably leads to the annihilation of the world" (35) -- this is the nihilistic challenge that Jacobi levels against metaphysics. From Maimon issue what Nisenbaum characterizes as two demands on philosophy:

all a priori knowledge -- or all transcendental conditions, including the forms of sensibility and the categories of the understanding -- [must] be systematically derived from a single principle; and he demands that any person wishing to inhabit a philosophical system [must] first actualize it. (56)

But Maimon is skeptical that either of these requirements can be met: while he is committed to the infinite intelligibility of everything -- he adheres to a very strong form of monistic rationalism opposed to Kant's discursive account of experience -- he also recognizes that such infinite intelligibility cannot in practice be grasped by finite creatures like us. We can know that reason demands a single first principle without being able to provide it. Likewise, Maimon "understands the standpoint that he would need to adopt in order to find satisfying answers to his questions concerning the possibility of real thought, yet he is unable to bring himself to adopt that standpoint" (105). Here, the second of Maimon's demands is not met, since he cannot 'actualize' the system of dogmatism.

The second part of the book focuses on the way that Fichte and Schelling seek to respond to Jacobi's and Maimon's challenges to philosophy. The emphasis here is on the ways in which practical philosophy provides an avenue to address these issues, by "radicalizing Kant's doctrine of the primacy of practical reasoning and upholding the view that reason as a whole is in some sense grounded in the practical" (111). Nisenbaum begins with a discussion of Kant's deduction of freedom as the key first step in this process. Kant's example of the person who would not be willing to give false testimony against an innocent and honorable man even on pains of execution shows, Nisenbaum argues, that we are capable of acting on principles that are not grounded in empirical interests or desire. Rather, we "demonstrate, by our affirmative answer to Kant's question that we are transcendentally free, capable of being determined by pure practical reason" (137). In so willing, we are 'summoned' to value our moral humanity, and in this respect the moral law "doesn't just express a fact of reason. It also expresses an act of reason: it expresses our commitment to the value of our humanity or rationality" (141). I'm not entirely convinced that this account fully vitiates Maimon's skeptical worries -- in his essay "The Moral Skeptic," for example, Maimon casts doubt on the claim that there is any such fact about our moral agency that the skeptic would accept -- but I think Nisenbaum is correct to argue that it is precisely this act that grounds Fichte's notion of self-positing that is found in the Wissenschaftslehre.

If Maimon's skepticism is addressed by the act of practical reason, Fichte's account of the positing of the absolute subject is, Nisenbaum argues, "designed to address Jacobi's complaint that all philosophy . . . tends to undermine itself" (148). Fichte's attempt to solve this problem begins with his notion of a self that posits itself immediately, which involves "the idea of an intellect that is at once the intellectual subject, intellectual object, and intellectual activity" (156). Such a subject constructs a goal for itself that it strives to achieve, and its consciousness involves the concept both of the object on which it acts and the concept of it being the subject's goal. As Nisenbaum argues, this means that Fichte extends Kant's notion of the primacy of the practical to encompass all conscious acts: "all representations with intentional content . . . are in some sense grounded in the practical" (159). The absolute I, with its real (or, what is traditionally viewed as practical) activity and ideal (or, theoretical) activity, then serves as the highest concept from which all else can be derived. This highest concept cannot be demonstrated -- it stands as a postulate -- but it reflects a commitment to a specific conception of the self that is rooted in the free exercise of its constructive activity. But, Nisenbaum claims, while Fichte's solution points us in the right direction, it does not go far enough to respond to the nihilistic worry, since it cannot provide an answer to the question of how the absolute I is opposed to the world, or, as Schelling asks, "'Why is there a realm of experience at all?'"(173).

The final part of the book takes up this question. Schelling's answer, Nisenbaum proposes, "moves toward the view that human experience is grounded in three irreducible elements -- God, the natural world, and human beings -- which relate to one another in three temporal dimensions: Creation, Revelation and Redemption" (178). Unlike Jacobi, Schelling argues that pantheism is compatible with freedom, and does not descend into fatalism or nihilism, so long as we reject Spinoza's mechanistic account of causation in favor of an organic conception of nature. Schelling suggests that such a view means that all natural entities are free or self-determined, but this gives rise to a new problem: what makes human freedom distinctive?

Schelling's answer comes in the idea that human freedom is capable of good and evil, and this serves as the lens for what Nisenbaum calls his heterodox idealism. In order to make sense of the capacity for evil as a genuine choice, rather than simply as a kind of irrational mistake, Schelling is led to the view that "the human person determines or individuates herself in relation to or in opposition to the divine person . . . evil can be explained as a form of defiance and goodness as a form of love" (191). The divine person, however, is initially inchoate: God emerges in an act of disclosure in which "the internal contradiction within God's nature comes to an end through the immediate effect of what is highest in God -- freedom -- on what is necessary -- nature" (197). The result is an organic totality in which each element is dependent on every other, but in which each maintains its own being: a "unity in duality and duality in unity" (197). Within this totality the human agent faces a choice: embrace one's place in the moral universe, or defiantly refuse to participate in God's disclosure and instead elevate one's self-interest above all else. Given Schelling's organic model, such evil is cast as a form of disease, "in which an individual organ or body part rebels against the system" (194). But in the face of the temptation to evil, God holds out the promise of redemption, where the human being proclaims unity with nature and "restores the natural world, God, and each human being to wholeness" (208). God is not whole, in other words, until completed by the free exercise of human goodness.

The theme of completion continues in the discussion of Rosenzweig's Star of Redemption. While many commentators have seen the Star as a rejection of German Idealism, Nisenbaum makes an excellent case for thinking that in fact Rosenzweig's views are largely continuous with Schelling's. The Star is a sprawling book, but Nisenbaum focuses on how the work "invites us to consider the human world as a response to the word of God, and it invites us to consider the connections we make with each other when we speak and act as the means for the unification of God" (212). For Nisenbaum, the Star is essentially a work of hope that we can know the All -- it provides us with an aspiration to "explain all aspects of human experience, [and] the desire to meet reason's demand for unconditioned explanation" (217). The Star can then be viewed as a long transcendental argument designed to show that "our ability to make objective statements about the world is inseparable from the determination of our values" (222), and in this respect the concept of truth is replaced by the concept of Creation, by which our values and view of the world are shaped.

Just as Schelling's God is initially inchoate, so too for Rosenzweig the three elements of the system -- God, humans and the world -- are at first incomplete, and must develop into a reciprocal All. In an echo of Schelling's account of goodness, for humans this development takes the revelatory form of being awakened to personhood in response to the divine call to love God, oneself and one another. A person must emerge from her 'particular nothing' and not only "individuate herself in relation to the divine person but also in relation to and contrast with other persons" (235). This last point is crucial, because for Rosenzweig, Redemption can only come when persons engage in acts of neighborly love, which serve as an ideal in which one person awakens another into personhood; in this respect, humans "reenact God's awakening of the soul" (238). As Nisenbaum notes, this awakening is a transformative process in which "by engaging in acts of neighborly love we open ourselves up to the renewal of our most basic orientation" (244). And in so doing, we would arrive at a "common conception of the good or to a shared understanding of our highest values," (246) and the redemption and unification of God, the world and humans would be complete. For Schelling and Rosenzweig, the conflict of reason is ultimately solved by the practical turn, in a recognition that "it is through our commitments, the values that we ascribe to ourselves when we form maxims for action, that God is both cognized and partly realized" (253). It is in this practical sense too that nihilism can be turned into hope, and metaphysics can be preserved and redeemed.

The brief summary here does not come close to doing justice to Nisenbaum's rich and provocative book, nor does it capture the deep commitment to the importance of philosophy that she clearly displays. The book is not a simple academic exercise, nor a display of philosophical cleverness, but rather a sincere and compelling call to recognize the centrality of the project of metaphysics -- understood in the systematic sense of German Idealism -- for our lives. As Nisenbaum puts it in an indicative passage, her hope "is that Rosenzweig's life, and the trajectory of thought that enabled him to address his most pressing philosophical and existential concerns . . . may enable each of us to affirm the value of the world and our own action in the world" (256). Yet the passion Nisenbaum shows for her topic also imposes a certain limitation on the work. This is especially the case with her conscious decision not to address Hegel (to say nothing of the nihilist strand of Idealism that leads through Schopenhauer), since Nisenbaum proposes that Hegel rejects the Kantian idea that "God or the Absolute is an object of faith, not knowledge" (15). Because Nisenbaum's book is "a defense of the love of metaphysics [and] a defense of the Kantian idea that the representation of God or the Absolute by finite beings is a topic of practical, not theoretical, philosophy," (16) Hegel does not play a role in her account. But that also means that the book cannot be a complete or exhaustive account of German Idealism, for even if Nisenbaum is right that the conflict of reason is the main prod to the thinkers of the period -- and I agree that it is of crucial importance -- Hegel too was motivated by this issue, and the fact that he chose a different way of addressing it suggests that Nisenbaum cannot really speak for German Idealism as whole, though the book is framed as such. At the very least, it would be helpful to see in more detail how Schelling's and Rosenzweig's views differ from Hegel's. But this is not a criticism so much as a call to recognize the scope of her work. If we think of the maps of German Idealism as typically being plotted largely along the lines of Hegel's thought, this book charts a very important alternative route, one that will be of great value to anyone interested in the period, or in the fate of metaphysics more broadly.