Force and Freedom: Kant's Legal and Political Philosophy

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Arthur Ripstein, Force and Freedom: Kant's Legal and Political Philosophy, Harvard UP, 2009, 399pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674035065.

Reviewed by Allen Wood, Stanford University



One sunny spring day nearly forty years ago, I was sitting in an open air café in Ithaca, New York, having coffee with Hans-Georg Gadamer. He was already over 70, and I was still in my twenties, having just published my first book on Kant. So our conversation, which consisted mainly of youth listening to the superior wisdom of age, centered on the current state of Kant scholarship. Gadamer said that the biggest single lacuna in Kant studies was the absence of a really good book on Kant’s Rechtslehre. It ought to be a book, he declared, that did not start out from Kantian ethics, but instead expounded Kant’s theory of human rights, law and politics authentically, solely on the ground of Kant’s concept of Recht: external freedom according to universal law. Gadamer told me I should write such a book — a recommendation I found flattering, but I also immediately (and silently) dismissed, partly because my principal interest in Kant was precisely in his ethics, but chiefly because I thought it could be done properly only by someone who had much more knowledge of law than I had, or ever intended to acquire. Since then I have read many good books on Kant’s legal and political philosophy, many by people I know and respect (one of them even based on a doctoral dissertation I supervised). Until now, however, I have never found the book Gadamer thought so badly needed to be written. But this book finally appears to be it.

Ripstein begins by rejecting as fundamentally un-Kantian the too familiar project of doing political philosophy by “applying general moral principles to the factual circumstances that make political society necessary” (p. 1). Instead, he begins by noting Kant’s sharp distinction between right and ethics, and proceeds from the Kantian concept of right or external freedom: action based on one’s own choice, or “independence from being constrained by another’s choice” (MS 6:237). Choice, Ripstein points out, for Kant as for Aristotle, is distinguished from mere wish by the fact that you take yourself to have the means available to pursue your end (p. 14). Freedom means pursuing ends you have chosen, rather than ends chosen for you by others. Basic to this concept of freedom is being “your own master” (sui juris), in contrast to being (like a slave or serf) subordinated to the will of another. As Ripstein points out, this concept of freedom was not new with Kant. It was drawn from what Quentin Skinner and Philip Pettit have called the “republican” (or “neo-republican”) tradition in early modern politics. As Skinner has argued in his recent book, Hobbes and Republican Liberty (2008), it was opposed by Hobbes. That Hobbes seems largely to have won out in the way philosophers think about freedom, is attested by the fact that on issue after issue, Ripstein must begin by arguing that from the Kantian standpoint, all the now familiar approaches ask the wrong questions, so that much of this book is a Kantian reformulation of the terms in which familiar issues of law and politics should be discussed.

The innate right to freedom concerns pursuit of your ends based on the means available through your own body. It is purely formal in the sense that it concerns only your rightful claim to pursue whatever purposes you set through whatever actions you choose. Kantian external freedom is not a matter of advantage, welfare or other “material” considerations, and the innate equality it involves is not a matter of an equal distribution of any benefit. The innate right to freedom needs to be extended, as Kant argues, to means outside your body through the right of property over things, and rights relating to other persons — of contract and of status — which comprehend the sphere of “private right”. These rights further need to be secured, enforced and determined by the creation of a common power capable of establishing a “condition of right” - the sphere of “public right”. Ripstein’s book is a survey of the arguments through which Kant constructs a theory that does all this, and a discussion of the issues of law and politics that arise in the course of doing it.

Chapter 1 is a general overview of Kant’s theory of law and justice. Chapter 2 expounds Kant’s conception of the innate right of humanity. It emphasizes the interpersonal character of Kant’s (neo)republican concept of freedom, and also the equality built into it as purely formal, in contrast to approaches that treat “equal” freedom as equal distribution of some benefit (p. 33). Kant’s theory divides right into two basic spheres: “private right” and “public right”. This book treats the former in Chapters 3-5 and the latter in Chapters 6-11.

“Private right” concerns property rights, and rights in relation to others based on contract and status. The innate right to freedom over your own body must be “extended” to things outside you. This requires a “postulate” (not independently demonstrable) that a free person may take control of an external object in rightful pursuit of an end. The right to a piece of property is basically the right to use it as a means (p. 103). Ownership, as Ripstein emphasizes, has a “mine or yours” structure — involving the exclusion of others from the use of the thing (pp. 58-59). In Chapters 3-4, Ripstein contrasts Kant’s approach to property rights not only with approaches that treat such rights as functions of some distributive agenda concerning the benefits of the use of things, but also with a Lockean approach. Whereas Locke allows a person to appropriate a thing subject only to the proviso that others are not made worse off, Kant insists that the formal character of right makes welfare considerations irrelevant, and the “mine or yours” structure of the right to things requires instead that any determinate and enforceable right of ownership requires a public or “omnilateral authorization” that cannot be found in a state of nature but becomes possible only in a “condition of right” or law-governed civil society, involving an authority empowered to act in the name of all (p. 90).

Chapter 5, on contract and consent, continues its emphasis on the purely formal character of the rights involved, which are therefore not based on such material considerations as mutual advantage. Ripstein argues for the Kantian thesis that rightfully sharing purposes with others is not possible merely through adding one person’s volition to another’s, but requires a “joining of wills” through mutual acts, each of which takes the other’s volitional act as an object (p. 113). Ripstein also argues that consent cannot be understood as a merely unilateral act, but always has the structure of an offer and an acceptance, requiring both parties to join their wills (pp. 120-128). This chapter also treats Kant’s discussion of the way in which one can own, not another person, but the other person’s status (as spouse, child or servant). Here he focuses mainly on issues of the parental responsibilities for children, and avoids taking up the other applications Kant makes of this category, which most of us today would regard as indefensible, or at best only partly defensible.

Chapter 6 turns to the need for a “rightful condition” or political state, and the role of legislation, executive power and the judiciary in constituting a state. On the Kantian account, private rights not only become determinate and enforceable only in the context of a state governed by a general will, but also it is possible truly to acquire something only in a civil condition. Ripstein’s Kantian account emphasizes that the state, in order to make good the defects of a pre-political condition in these respects must be empowered to act in the name of all its members. He contrasts this with a libertarian model, according to which a state is the creation of private persons empowered, essentially as only another private person, to do what they have set it up to do. Chapters 7 and 8 emphasize the public and universal function of the law, and the fact that a condition of right requires certain forms of mandatory co-operation that could not, from a Kantian standpoint, be justified on any grounds of welfare or private benefit.

Chapter 7’s treatment of international right seems hard to reconcile with what Kant defends in all his main writings on the subject. He argues in effect that a rightful international organization of states can never be more than what Kant calls a ‘congress’ (MS 6:351):

Perpetual peace is unattainable because the only rightful forum for establishing it is voluntary and can be dissolved … A permanent congress of states has no resources to perpetuate itself, and any member is entitled to withdraw from it (p. 230).

Ripstein thus appears to regard as indefensible both what Kant proposes as a ‘federation of nations’ (Völkerbund) and the more ambitious international project he calls a ‘state of nations’(Völkerstaat) (MS 6:346, 351, EF 8:356-357).

In Chapter 9, Ripstein argues at length that the Kantian state has wide powers and responsibilities when it comes to economic control and redistribution. The fact that Kant’s theory of right is grounded solely on the individual’s right to freedom (independence of another’s will) has suggested to many it must be libertarian in spirit. But Ripstein points out that while “Kant’s understanding of the basic range of public powers is austere in one sense, [it is] permissive in another”. The state may act only in ways consistent with each citizen’s innate right to freedom, but its duty to create and maintain a rightful condition involves powers that are “capacious and open-ended” and “does not preclude most of the familiar activities of modern states” (p. 223). It may not redistribute resources for the sake of anyone’s welfare or any material ends, but it is sometimes positively required to do so in order to protect the freedom and independence of individual citizens. This would include not only protecting them from a condition of poverty that threatens their bodily survival (a condition of free agency) but also from relations of dependency on others. Ripstein argues, for instance, that when the poor are supported through any form of charity, however benevolently intended, this puts them in essentially the same position they would be in if they were slaves. He therefore emphasizes Kant’s rejection of private or religious charity, and his insistence that the poor should be provided for through taxation of the rich (pp. 282-283). Ripstein also argues that on a Kantian account, “if illness and medical expenses regularly lead citizens to fall into conditions of dependency, a state can act proactively to provide publicly funded universal health care” (p. 285).

Chapter 10 takes up the state’s right to punish crime, and Ripstein’s position broadly follows that of Sharon Byrd, who emphasizes the state’s right coercively to prevent wrong, and sees Kant’s well-known retributivism as conditioned by this aim. Ripstein supplements this interpretation chiefly by arguing on Kantian formal grounds that punishment must be drawn from the nature of the criminal’s act (rather than from consequentialist or deterrence considerations), claiming that this underwrites Kant’s insistence on the Ius Talionis. There is no space here to say why I regard this interpretation of Kant, though sympathetic and philosophically plausible, to be textually indefensible.

Chapter 11 discusses Kant’s notorious rejection of the right of revolution. Ripstein offers an interpretation similar to Jan Joerden and Alyssa Bernstein: Kant may redescribe many cases in which his position is thought indefensible. Kant may not approve the revolutionary overthrow of a legal order, but he may regard as permissible or even obligatory the creation of a condition of right out of one he would call ‘barbarism’ — organized coercion without law. Ripstein defends such a treatment of the case of Nazi Germany in some empirical detail, making a very persuasive case for this Kantian approach to it.

The fact that Kant’s theory of right proceeds solely from the concept of right and the innate right to freedom, and not from any moral principle, does not entirely settle the vexed question of the relation between Kant’s “supreme principle of right” (MS 6:230) and the categorical imperative that grounds Kantian ethics. How can the doctrine of right (Recht), if it proceeds independently of the doctrine of virtue or ethics (Tugend, Ethik), also constitute a part — indeed, the first part — of Kant’s comprehensive theory of morals (Sitten)? Ripstein postpones to an Appendix his consideration of this very basic but also very difficult question.

What Ripstein says there, however, seems to me unclear, perhaps even inconsistent. He begins by claiming that “The Universal Principle of Right really does follow from the Categorical Imperative, but is not equivalent to it” (p. 358). He then cites Kant’s claim that the principle of right enters “as a postulate that is incapable of further proof” (MS 6:359). This (among many other Kantian assertions) would seem directly to contradict the claim that it “follows from” the principle of ethics. Ripstein argues, however, that as a “postulate”, right “extends” the principle of morality “because as a rational being you could not will a universal law under which you could never set a purpose for yourself, or one under which you could only do so with the leave of another” (p. 371). Thus the principle of right “provides a license to consider things in space and time under laws of freedom” (p. 361). “Such an argument,” he says, “is not a derivation of the Universal Principle of Right from the Categorical Imperative; it only shows the former to be the legitimate extension of the latter” (p. 372). But if the principle of right involves an “extension” of the categorical imperative, and is not a “derivation” from it, how can it also “follow” from it? And if the principle of right is such an “extension” why doesn’t Kant present it this way — by first stating the Categorical imperative and then explicitly introducing the concept of right as an “extension” of it? I confess I can’t make sense of Ripstein’s line of reasoning here. I can only report that I find it, and his attempt to resolve the main question, deeply unsatisfying.

This book, therefore, can’t be said to settle the deepest problem about Kant’s theory of right. It also does not provide, in my view, a satisfactory interpretation of certain parts of it, such as punishment and international right. Nevertheless Ripstein does ably expound Kant’s theory of right in the way it ought to be expounded, and he gives thoughtful discussion of a wide range of issues from the authentically Kantian perspective on right and politics. In that respect, I am more than satisfied with this book. But I’m sorry that Gadamer, though he lived to the age of 102, still did not live long enough to read it.