Forgiveness: A Philosophical Exploration

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Charles L. Griswold, Forgiveness: A Philosophical Exploration, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 242pp., $21.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521703512.

Reviewed by Ernesto V. Garcia, University of Massachusetts, Amherst


Forgiveness: A Philosophical Exploration is a masterful treatment of a central issue in moral philosophy. Well-written, penetrating, and rich in details, this book discusses a number of related topics including interpersonal forgiveness, political apology, pardon, and civic reconciliation. It not only provides a broad historical survey of the views on forgiveness of many important philosophers such as Plato, Aristotle, Seneca, Epicurus, Butler, Hume, Smith, Nietzsche, and Arendt, but also offers insightful analyses of related concepts including trust, narrative, sympathy and empathy, truth-telling, and moral luck. At the end of the day, even if one does not fully agree with all of Griswold's main theses -- many of which, as we shall see, are quite controversial -- there is still an extraordinary amount to be learned from this impressive account.

The book starts with a historical discussion of forgiveness. The main contrast here is between ancient views -- such as those of Plato, Aristotle, the Stoics and the Epicureans -- and modern views. Contrary to the traditional belief endorsed by thinkers like Hannah Arendt that forgiveness is exclusively a Judeo-Christian as opposed to pagan idea, Griswold argues that forgiveness and related notions are indeed present in Greek and Roman thought. Nonetheless, classical philosophers -- as well as modern philosophers influenced by them, most notably Nietzsche -- do not consider forgiveness a genuine virtue. Griswold offers four reasons why stemming from classical doctrines about perfectionism and human dignity. First of all, given their moral perfectionism, classical thinkers assume that (i) virtuous persons such as Aristotle's megalopsuchos would by definition be morally perfect and so not stand in need of forgiveness by others. In addition, they would likely be unforgiving of others insofar as (ii) they would have no interest in sympathetically grasping the situation and moral faults of non-virtuous persons; (iii) they would deem themselves immune to moral injury by the non-virtuous; and lastly, (iv) given a hierarchical system of values, they would not regard the non-virtuous as making reciprocal moral claims upon them or having equal moral standing, in contrast to our modern ideal of human dignity. In the end, such thinkers deny the basic idea of mutual vulnerability. That is, they insist that even though a virtuous person may be subject to physical injury, she is immune from suffering moral harm from the non-virtuous due to the special protection that virtue affords -- a claim made famous by Plato's Socrates in the Apology ("Neither Meletus nor Anytus can harm me in any way; he could not harm me, for I do not think it is permitted that a better man be harmed by a worse" (30d)) and endorsed by many later thinkers.

This stands in stark contrast to our modern conception of forgiveness. Focusing on Bishop Butler's seminal analysis, Griswold argues that we today see ourselves as moral equals who are affective, embodied and genuinely vulnerable to moral injury from others. Given this situation, we not only feel resentment when others wrongfully injure us; we also rightly seek to overcome such resentment in light of the moral demand to forgive. Griswold examines several interesting aspects of Butler's views, including the distinction between forgiveness and the public administration of justice and the demand to take up a disinterested viewpoint towards our wrongdoers, an idea later expanded upon by Adam Smith. Most importantly, he corrects one standard misreading of Butler's views. He convincingly shows that Butler insists that, when forgiving somebody, we are not required to forswear resentment but only to moderate it, although he does require that we forswear revenge.

This sets the stage for Griswold's own account of forgiveness. He criticizes Butler's analysis as inadequate, arguing that full-fledged forgiveness demands not only that we moderate resentment and forswear revenge but that we strive for the continued abatement and eventual elimination of resentment altogether for moral reasons. The main idea underlying Griswold's analysis is his claim that "forgiveness comes with certain conditions or norms" (47). More concretely, forgiveness involves a norm-governed social dyadic relationship in which the offender and victim are mutually dependent. Seen this way, we cannot speak of a victim just freely bestowing forgiveness as a gift on her wrongdoer. Rather, both parties must satisfy certain conditions to qualify as what Griswold deems "paradigmatic" cases of forgiveness. He outlines six criteria for offender and victim, including, for the former, repudiating one's prior actions, expressing regret, committing to be a better person, understanding the nature of the harm from the injured party's perspective, and offering some narrative account of how she came to do the wrong and is now becoming worthy of approbation, and for the latter, the forswearing of revenge, moderation and eventual commitment to let go of resentment altogether, a reframing of both the wrongdoer (as not simply a bad person) and of herself (as not decisively morally superior to the wrongful offender), and some express declaration that forgiveness is granted. In light of such conditions, Griswold explores both the limits of forgiveness -- in particular, whether anybody can be deemed unforgivable -- and three non-paradigmatic cases of forgiveness which fail to satisfy his basic criteria: (1) third-party forgiveness, where we are neither the victim nor offender; (2) self-forgiveness, where we seem to be both the victim and offender; and (3) unilateral forgiveness, where the victim extends forgiveness even though the offender fails to meet the specified conditions either because the latter is dead or unrepentant.

Lastly, Griswold shifts his focus from forgiveness in interpersonal relationships to the broader political context. Strikingly, he rejects the very idea of forgiveness in politics, in either its paradigmatic or non-paradigmatic forms. Instead of political forgiveness, he argues that what is most suitable for the public sphere is the related yet distinct idea of political apology. He offers several reasons here, including the sheer complexity of the public domain, its impersonal character which downplays the role played by those interpersonal moral sentiments central to forgiveness, and the fact that admissions of wrongdoings are usually symbolic in character, proffered and accepted by mere representatives of the original parties. This choice is reflected in our everyday discourse, where the language of forgiveness is uncommon both in legal literature and at the level of international relations, where public admissions of wrongdoing are more typically couched in phrases such as "we regret" and "we apologize", and where the basic response aimed at by such admissions seems to be not forgiveness but simple acceptance of the apology, as reflected by the common diplomatic expression that the apology has been "noted". Griswold perceptively analyzes many concrete examples of political apology including the University of Alabama and its past connections with slavery, Archbishop Tutu and South African Churches, King Hussein of Jordan and the wrongful deaths of several Israeli citizens, the U.S. government with respect to both African-American lynchings and the internment of Japanese Americans, and failed political apologies such as Robert McNamara's mea culpa regarding the Vietnam War and Richard Nixon's resignation. He concludes with a highly insightful and in-depth analysis of one famous attempt at public reconciliation without explicit apology: namely, the Vietnam Veterans Memorial commissioned in the 1980's. He argues that it fails to achieve its aims insofar as it memorializes the service of American soldiers while entirely sidestepping the issue of whether the national decision to go to war was itself a justified one. In this way, he argues, "the question of political apology does not arise because the question of the justice of the war, and with it the responsibility for the war, is avoided" (207). As he concludes, emphasizing the fundamental role that truth-telling must play in the narrative accounts involved with both interpersonal forgiveness and political apology:

But forgetting is the path to ignorant repetition, and remembering is a necessary condition of living both wisely and in light of the truth … Without honest assessment of the past, no memory worth having; without honest memory, no present worth living; without apologies for injuries done, no future worth hoping for. (209)

The main strengths of Griswold's book are his rigorous style of argumentation, the conceptual clarity he sheds upon nearly all major issues related to forgiveness, and the deep philosophical wisdom and sensitivity he brings to bear upon a sheer wealth of illuminating examples of both interpersonal forgiveness and political apology. In the space remaining, I want to highlight a few minor issues and then spend the majority of time addressing what seems to be the most fundamental worry about his general approach: namely, the idea that forgiveness must be conditional in nature.

One initial and deeply puzzling aspect of Griswold's account concerns his treatment of classical ideas about forgiveness. Ironically, despite the fact that he rejects the common wisdom that, as he puts it, "forgiveness and related notions" are mainly Judeo-Christian as opposed to pagan ideas, his overall investigation belies this claim. He notes that the main Greek term for forgiveness is sungnômê, often translated as to 'sympathize', 'forbear', 'forgive', 'pardon', 'make allowance for', or 'excuse'. However, in nearly every analysis, he argues that sungnômê is best understood not as forgiveness but some related concept. For example, when discussing Aristotle's two main uses of sungnômê in the Nicomachean Ethics -- (i) when we act due to external force or in ignorance, or (ii) when we akratically act out of emotion -- he acknowledges that, with regard to (i), sungnômê "means something like excusing" (5), and that, with regard to (ii), "it seems best to interpret this as a matter of excuse and pardon rather than forgiveness" (6). This pattern persists throughout his analysis, where he concludes that the uses of sungnômê in Plato are typically best translated as either 'excuse' or 'sympathy' or 'lenience' rather than forgiveness or else are highly ambiguous between forgiveness and excuse (10fn.13); that for the Stoics, "[f]orgiveness ends up being understood as a kind of pardon" (13); and that Epicurus and Lucretius "scarcely mention or allude to forgiveness" (13). Indeed, contra Griswold, his own argument for why classical thinkers would not regard forgiveness as a virtue only seems to reinforce the general perception of the "common wisdom" that -- apart from what seem to be a small handful of isolated and/or debatable cases -- classical thinkers only recognize, as he puts it, "related notions" such as excuse, pardon, compassion, lenience, sympathy, or toleration rather than our traditional concept of forgiveness itself.

Another worry involves the stark public/private dichotomy presupposed by his key contrast between interpersonal forgiveness and political apology. Following Butler's distinction between forgiveness and the administration of justice, Griswold argues that forgiveness is only appropriate in the private sphere of interpersonal relationships whereas the public sphere demands something entirely different, namely, political apology which is "characterized precisely by its lack of relation to sentiment" (140) and which, "unlike forgiveness, does not claim to articulate the sentiments and motivations of individuals" (151). While I am sympathetic to this view, it involves many controversial assumptions. Most obviously, it raises basic feminist worries about an overly rigidified public/private dichotomy as well as the exclusive -- and many would argue excessive -- valorization of a certain moral outlook for politics: that is, a highly abstract, impersonal perspective which requires political figures to be wholly detached from their personal sentiments and concrete relational attachments in the context of public admissions of wrongdoing.

My last worry concerns one main tenet underlying his entire analysis: namely, the idea that forgiveness is conditional in nature. In the Prologue, Griswold writes: "A fundamental thesis of this book is that forgiveness is a concept that comes with conditions attached. It is governed by norms. Forgiveness has not been given, or received, simply because one believes or feels that it has been" (xv). He identifies three "baseline conditions" that must be met to qualify as genuine forgiveness: (i) the willingness of the victim to lower her pitch of resentment; (ii) the willingness of the offender to take minimal steps to qualify for forgiveness; and (iii) that the injury be humanly forgivable. He concludes: "Only when all three are met does forgiveness come off at all" (115). This gives rise to many counterintuitive results, particularly in relation to his treatment of unilateral forgiveness. He argues that unless the offender takes steps towards becoming worthy of forgiveness, then forgiveness does not take place even if the victim wants and chooses to forgive her wrongdoer. There seems to be a basic conceptual confusion here. Is it really the case that we cannot forgive in circumstances where our wrongdoer remains unrepentant or just that we should not forgive? Notably, Griswold shifts here between several different terms to characterize forgiveness, never fully explaining how they relate to each other: normative versus non-normative, conditional versus unconditional, ideal versus non-ideal, paradigmatic versus non-paradigmatic, mere approximation versus a genuine instance, perfect versus imperfect, partial versus complete, as well as the distinct concept of reconciliation. He seems correct to argue that unilateral forgiveness -- insofar as both parties are not involved in taking the appropriate moral steps towards eventual reconciliation -- is somehow imperfect or falls short of ideal forgiveness. But is it right to say that cases in which the victim forgives, but the offender is either unrepentant or dead, do not even count as genuine forgiveness at all -- that, in Griswold's own words, "it is not forgiving, but something else that seeks forgiveness but has not yet crossed the threshold" (121-2)?

His arguments for why the victim cannot unilaterally bestow forgiveness seem unconvincing. He rhetorically asks:

May the injured party rightly forgive (or withhold forgiveness) with no conditions attached? What if he is insane, or suffering from mental blocks that have nothing to do with the relevant events, or seriously unbalanced: is whatever he decides with respect to forgiveness acceptable? I have argued throughout for a negative answer to these last two questions. (67)

But while it is surely correct to insist (i) that we should not conceive of forgiveness as having "no conditions attached" and (ii) that it is not the case that "whatever the victim decides" with regard to forgiveness is acceptable -- that is, as Griswold rightly argues here, the offender must satisfy certain minimal conditions such as being a responsible moral agent -- this by no means entails the highly controversial further condition (iii) that the offender must be repentant for forgiveness to even be possible. From a normative standpoint, it is clearly preferable that the wrongdoer repents. Ideally, forgiveness should involve mutual reciprocity such that both victim and offender respond in morally appropriate ways. But this does not mean that instances where the victim forgives the offender even though the latter remains stubbornly unrepentant or has died do not count as genuine forgiveness at all. It seems that our ordinary intuitions are that the victim can genuinely forgive her wrongdoers in such cases -- that is, that the minimum threshold for forgiveness is met or forgiveness comes off even though it fails to aspire to the level of ideal forgiveness where full-fledged reconciliation is achieved. This is an important point to observe since Griswold himself explicitly declares in the Prologue: "Our task is to understand the notion [of forgiveness] and its conceptual structure, not to revolutionize it" (xvii).

Despite the disagreements noted above, and there are inevitably others that may arise -- I have additional concerns particularly about his similar conditional analysis of the unforgivable as well as his account of third-party forgiveness -- it is clear that this book is a remarkable achievement that will undoubtedly shape, in enormously beneficial ways, future philosophical debates on the topic of forgiveness.