Forgiveness and Love

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Glen Pettigrove, Forgiveness and Love, Oxford University Press, 2012, 200pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199646555.

Reviewed by Jeremy David Bendik-Keymer, Case Western Reserve University


Pettigrove's is a broad-minded study using a common-sense approach.[1] His modest argument aims to clear up some problems about when forgiveness is possible, permissible, even "admirable" (104, 150). His book's title refers to one of the problems: need forgiveness be loving?

In Pettigrove's spirit, I'll sift through the "diverse phenomenon" (159) he addresses. But I'll seek an underlying logic where the interpersonal diverges from the moral, bearing on it indirectly, underscoring a different account of love. Pettigrove's account remains trapped within practical reason. Yet loving is quintessentially relational, impractical. Just so, forgiveness is something loving.

When common sense eschews the concept, it doesn't do the work it should. Remaining arbitrary, assuming a community of like-minded people, it claims to speak for "us."[2] Identifying an underlying logic clarifies things when common sense is conflicted, vague, or confused. The beauty of interpersonal life underlies forgiveness.

The wrong to be forgiven throws you in doubt.

Chapters 2, 3, 4, 6, and 7 explore the kind of wrong forgiveness can, may, or admirably would address.[3] Chapter 2 also explores who may forgive, but the focus actually reverts to the wrong addressed by forgiveness. My strategy in this section and the next will be to shadow the problems Pettigrove explores while pointing to the logic underlying their solutions.

Can only victims forgive? In chapter 2, Pettigrove considers three accounts that have been used to answer, "Yes." The first models forgiveness on cancelling a debt (21ff.), the second on a change of heart dissipating resentment or anger (24ff.), and the third locates forgiveness in a disrupted relationship (30ff.). But the debt-cancelling account doesn't make sense of how changing one's heart matters when forgiving (unlike forgiving, cancelling a debt can be perfunctory), and besides, third parties can cancel debts. As to the second account: people other than the victim can understandably harbor resentment over what a victim suffered. And finally, against the third account, there doesn't need to be a prior relationship for one to be able to forgive another.

All of these objections are true in the sense Pettigrove gives them. Yet regardless of friendship or intimacy, what links third party, victim, and wrong-doer? An interpersonal order. This, at least, is torn when someone wrongs another. Pettigrove understands relationship only in a thick sense implying intimacy of some form (31). But if we admit of a minimal, interpersonal order -- sometimes called "the social trust" or "common humanity," even "community"-- we can understand (a) why the wrong involves the forgiver taking something personally, (b) why those surrounding the victim can take the wrong personally, and (c) why we do not need an intimate relationship with someone to find the violation of him a violence to the order of interpersonal life. Accordingly, Pettigrove's chapter 2 actually pushes, inchoately, toward a characterization of the wrong that can be forgiven: it's a wrong tearing the fabric of interpersonal life. So not only the victim can be in a position to forgive.

Are deeds the things to be forgiven? Chapter 3 develops Hume's observation that acts don't seem to be the things we take to heart with people (42). If someone's character is good, mistakes are excusable. They aren't offensive wrongs. Of course, some deeds are so bad that even if someone's been good, what he does is still awful. But where Hume is right is in his emphasis on character: someone who does something horrible appears in a new light. Some things good people simply do not do. "How could you do that?!"

So Pettigrove argues that acts aren't the only things that can be forgiven. The way we do things can reveal our characters. When repeated, mistakes can become a pattern of negligence or disrespect (49-50). Attitudes -- or the lack of them-- can reveal, even in model behavior, an underlying lack of consideration (45-46).

So wrongs to be forgiven throw a person into doubt. I think it isn't so much the character revealed as the person -- the one responsible for his character. Consider forgiving the defiant, something Pettigrove thinks is permissible and possible. If the defiant can still have bad characters that we must hold morally accountable, what we forgive is them, despite their characters. The wrong to be forgiven is personal in this precise sense: it throws the person who wronged into doubt, and it is taken personally by those who try to forgive. Forgiveness appears to concern a way we take moral wrongs. And this points to the space of the relational interacting with the moral.

Do sob stories help? In chapter 4, Pettigrove asks how a person's story might affect how we see his wrong (69ff.). A narrative that excuses a person no longer deals with forgiveness. But a narrative that isn't an excuse can help those wronged take it less personally (68). And that, claims Pettigrove, is helpful for forgiveness. His recognition of taking things personally is a signal moment.

What about the defiant -- is it all right[4] to forgive them? Chapter 6 asks whether we may forgive the unapologetic, while chapter 7 deepens the question through the more general issue of whether forgiveness must be deserved. Does the one who's wrong need to have taken, or have begun to take, responsibility for his wrong? Pettigrove thinks that forgiveness needn't be the kind of thing to wait on repentance, and this implies that the wrong to be forgiven can involve persistence or denial.

What's interesting to me is this. If, to be forgiven, the wronging one needn't take responsibility for his wrong, then forgiveness restores support for another person even when that person hasn't shown the minimal marks of personhood -- taking responsibility.[5] Forgiveness would then be aimed toward a person's future, despite his past. It would hold open a potential, a priori, despite the evidence. Here's the mark of underlying logic: to be interpersonal implies taking the other as a person.


Chapters 1, 4, 5, 6, and 7 explore forgiveness itself. What kind of thing is forgiveness -- an act, utterance, feeling or something else? In chapter 1, Pettigrove works negatively through what forgiveness is not. Addressing those "declarative" accounts holding that forgiveness must be uttered, Pettigrove observes silent forgiveness. An attitude alone can change, and forgiveness might not even be apparent to the one forgiven, especially given distance or years passed (9ff.). Suppose, then, that forgiveness is a feeling. But we needn't overcome anger or resentment to forgive (3), for it is intelligible to forgive another without being resentful. I might be anxious instead, or I might not feel anything at all -- just know that something the person did could reasonably throw him into doubt or get to me personally. At least, then, wouldn't forgiveness be a part of an intimate relationship -- a kind of intimacy (12ff.)? Yet while forgiveness restores some kind of commitment to the one forgiven, and so some kind of bare relationship, it needn't involve a return to the prior depth or extent of an intimate relationship.

So forgiveness needn't be an act, a feeling or an intimacy. What is it then? How can it involve  any one of these things, as well as attitudes? Forgiveness is a relation, and that's how. Relations are logical, so to speak. We can take them up in a variety of ways.

What kind of relation? With chapter 4, Pettigrove separates forgiveness from understanding and excusing. If there is such a thing as forgiveness, it is conceptually different than excusing. Forgiving assumes recognizing wrong, not dissolving it. Moreover, not only needn't we understand the wrong one or his deed, but it can be bad to do so (62). Some wrongs defy understanding beyond very general psychological or sociological claims and issue from confusion so deep that to follow them out is a bad use of time and energy. Rather, instead of necessarily understanding, forgiving implies a kind of restoring. It is a restorative relation. Restoring what, or who?

Pettigrove doesn't say. I think forgiveness restores our support for the person who was wrong. After forgiving, I no longer throw him into doubt. I hold open a space in which he can take responsibility for himself, even if his character is corrupt. I hold open a space in which we can again engage interpersonally, restarting or redeveloping a relationship that has some depth or character, starting firstwith simply relating as people -- in bare common humanity, so to speak, our lives and our world beginning anew, tentatively, on an a priori commitment. Would Pettigrove agree?

In what way is forgiveness unconditional? Chapters 6 and 7 explore how forgiveness is permissible with an unapologetic person and admirable with an undeserving one. There isn't a reason why we can't both hold someone accountable and forgive him (108): the two are joined in moral education and obligatory community service "all the time." "I forgive you. Now you still need to take responsibility for this." Pettigrove drives a wedge between moral accountability and the particular relation forgiveness is. Although he never says so, there must be a relation here akin to hating the sin but loving the sinner.

I think this moment is important. Pettigrove begins to isolate a conceptual space between (a) deeds, (b) character and (c) personhood. Moral accountability addresses (a) and (b), but forgiveness addresses (c). Moreover, since we are morally obligated to recognize (c), forgiveness must be a relation involved with restoring our relationship to another, rather than in upholding moral respect. Moral respect must be given at all times to all people, regardless of what they have done or who they are in character. But the concept of forgiveness can't assume we must be immoral before we must forgive (i.e., by having not recognized a person's moral standing)! Whatever is personal in forgiveness is outside morality, even if we take morality personally. There's a logical space here that's missing. It explains why forgiveness can be needed in addition to moral accountability, which is always needed even if we don't think a wrong calls for forgiveness.

In chapter 4, Pettigrove claims that forgiveness needn't be loving, but if one loves another, one must eventually forgive him for his wrong (103). Pettigrove's argument depends on a characterization of love -- unaware of Jollimore[6] -- as a form of vision. Separating love into affective, cognitive, and volitional elements, Pettigrove claims the affective is so arbitrary as to be useless in discerning love (101: people feel all sorts of ways in love). He thinks love's cognition sees the beloved as good (77), which he interprets, following Jean Hampton, as seeing some good in the beloved (97). Love's volition will commit to support the one who contains some good -- i.e., the loved-one qua container of some good.

Now Pettigrove thinks that love's cognition must be present in forgiveness. To forgive, we must see some good in the one we're trying to forgive. But Pettigrove demurs on love's will, because he thinks that "we" might forgive another not for the sake of the good in him but because of other loyalties -- perhaps to the victim, or to our mother, or to God (98). I confess that these possibilities escape me.

Suppose instead, as is consistent with all the rest of Pettigrove's account, forgiveness were centered on the interpersonal or (as I will call it), the relational. The relational isn't a practical realm, isn't concerned with what you hold, but with who you are. Its proper subject is we, or -- alive to difference -- you and I. The relational is relevant to the practical and to the moral, often as a condition, but is conceptually distinct from them. It is the logic in which we recognize each other as persons, connect, and in which the kind of knowing we develop is neither objective knowledge nor know-how but is rather a personal sensibility, an aptitude to connect with each other beyond manipulation or objectification. Without the interpersonal, the moral isn't possible and the practical is inhuman (robotic). Moreover, when the interpersonal order is violated, it can be difficult to go on as a person. Taking something personally, our world of interpersonal trust gets thrown.

Suppose, then, that love -- far from being some mode of practical desire in which people are essentially seen as goods (!), or, even worse, assumed in our judgment under the logic of acting for some end -- were relational, in fact, a normative expression of relational reason, its quintessence manifesting what the relational essentially is. Then, any act that restores the interpersonal relation would be a loving act.[7]

This of course risks begging the question on forgiveness. But I have a hard time accepting that I am actually forgiving someone if I'm forgiving him for the sake of my mother. That would appear to make him a means to my end. What Pettigrove misses here is the relational logic -- the groove of thought, to echo Michael Thompson -- that forgiveness appears to occupy. Forgiveness would appear to concern a relation, the one side of which involves me having taken something personally and the other side of which involves him being thrown into doubt as a person, appearing to not be responsible to other people or even to himself. One would think that when forgiveness restores the interpersonal relation here, allowing me to not take the wrong personally anymore and giving the wrong doer another chance as a person who can be responsible to our shared life, that I am focused at least on him, full stop. Hence, Velleman and Ebels-Duggan appear to be closer to the logic of both love and forgiveness than Pettigrove understands (88-89).

In chapters 6 and 7, Pettigrove considers whether forgiving the defiant involves either condoning wrong or degrading oneself. He rightly concludes that neither need be true. In fact, neither should be true. If forgiveness is a relational -- not a moral -- concept, then holding another accountable is a separate matter, conceptually and actually, than forgiving another. Forgiveness could then neither firstcondemn nor later condone. Forgiveness simply starts with a wrong taken personally that throws another into doubt. Secondly, far from being degrading, forgiving involves an affirmation of ourbecoming persons, anew and again, through the way we choose to relate to each other. Especially in the face of the defiant, it's damn admirable to hold open the personal while holding steady the moral. That takes what family systems therapists call "differentiation."

Labor of the concept

Up to a point, Pettigrove's study is admirable for its patience and common sense. We reach that point when we have divergent interpretations of what makes sense. Very often in Pettigrove's study, I found his constant invocation of what "we" believe jarring, but never more than when I didn't believe what he assumed his readers do. One strong and differing intuition makes common sense arbitrary. That's why we need the labor of the concept.[8]

[1] Pettigrove draws on forty years of analytic ethics, hermeneutics, experimental psychology, psychoanalysis, theology, literature -- even Foucault -- and follows his topic without partisanship. French "non-philosophy" was the only puzzling absence -- e.g., Jankélevitch, Derrida.

Pettigrove wants to "accommodate . . . experiences that, in ordinary language, we call forgiveness [sic.] " (151), "to make . . . sense of our common practices" (151), "paying careful attention to everyday experiences of anger and forgiveness" (159). The "upshot of [his] argument . . . , taken as a whole, is that forgiveness is a more diverse phenomenon than is typically acknowledged in the philosophical literature" (159). Hence his common sense approach is consistent with hermeneutics in Ricœur's sense: broadening the "space" of (one might even say, for) language.

[2] Pettigrove claims to "shed light on the nature of forgiveness, the conditions that make it possible, and the norms by which it is governed" (xiii). But this essentially normative inquiry can be at odds with his common sense approach in all cases where forgiveness isn't simply a conventional matter or where the community remains divided about forgiveness -- something fairly common!

[3] Chapter 1, "I forgive you" examines what forgiveness is.

Chapter 2, "The standing to forgive" examines who can forgive.

Chapter 3, "Forgiveness and character" examines the role of character in the wrong to be forgiven.

Chapter 4, "Understanding, excusing, forgiving" examines the role of understanding in forgiveness.

Chapter 5, "Forgiveness and love" asks whether forgiveness must be loving.

Chapter 6, "Unapologetic forgiveness" asks whether there must be repentance for forgiveness to be permissible.

And chapter 7, "Forgiveness and grace" explores the virtue of forgiving someone who doesn't deserve it.

Chapter 8 qualifies the sense in which Pettigrove has advanced an account of unconditional forgiveness.

[4] i.e., permissible

[5] On the link between being a person and taking responsibility, I am drawing on Charles Larmore's (2010) The Practices of the Self. Chicago: University of Chicago Press.

[6] Troy Jollimore (2011). Love's Vision. Princeton: Princeton University Press

[7] To reduce love to the practical is an extremely deep philosophical tendency, rooted at origin in the character Socrates' account of Diotima's art of love in Plato's Symposium. The reduction is common today, notably in Jollimore (most recently) and in others who insist on love primarily involving valuing (optionality), or seeing or seeking good. The one score where recent Continental work on love clearly advances over mainstream Anglophone work is where love is not seen as primarily axiological but as connective. Here a range of people win out, from Luce Irigaray to Jean-Luc Nancy: all those who have taken the challenge to conceptualize the interpersonal against Heidegger's avoidance of Mitsein. The place in Plato where this alternate tradition begins is in Aristophanes' speech in Symposium and in what Alcibiades intimated but Socrates didn't understand: that love isn't about seeing the good in each other but is about connecting as people. What a tragedy.

[8] For more on relational reason, see my (2012) "Do you have a conscience?" inaugural issue of the Journal of Global Ethical Leadership. I want to thank Elaine Wolf for discussions related to this review and to teaching me her profession's concept of differentiation. Thanks also to my Spring 2013 seminar In Love!