Forgiveness and Remembrance: Remembering Wrongdoing in Personal and Public Life

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Jeffrey M. Blustein, Forgiveness and Remembrance: Remembering Wrongdoing in Personal and Public Life, Oxford University Press, 2014, 344pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199329403.

Reviewed by Jeffrey S. Helmreich, University of California, Irvine


Forgiving and feeling seem deeply related, but the precise nature of the relationship is elusive. On the one hand, if I forgive you but continue to feel angry or bitter about what you did, you could reasonably ask what difference my forgiveness has made. Indeed, what was its point? But if, on the other hand, forgiveness requires an emotional overhaul, banishing unpleasant recollection of the wrong suffered, it would be almost impossible -- at least as a single act or gesture. For how could anyone reliably forswear the emotional responses that memories could naturally trigger, at any moment, in the years or even decades to come?

And how could any self-respecting -- and prudent -- victims cease altogether to recall what they suffered, even if it is emotionally fraught? Forgiveness with no change of heart seems empty, but forgiveness as emotional transformation seems fanciful. What, then, is the relationship between forgiving and the emotional remembrance of being wronged?

Philosophers no longer come to these sorts of questions empty-handed. Instead, we can harvest the products of a recent renaissance in the philosophical treatment of forgiveness, launched by the landmark contributions of Charles Griswold, Jean Hampton, Pamela Hieronymi and Jeffrie Murphy. But never has this particular aspect of forgiveness been the object of such sustained and thoughtful treatment as in this great new book by Jeffrey Blustein.

That is a bit misleading, though. Blustein's book is not best understood as an argument or solution to a conundrum. Rather, in the spirit of his earlier work on memory, it is better seen as a rich, profound and thoroughgoing account of a set of interrelated phenomena -- in this case, forgiveness and the memory of past wrongdoings, both at the interpersonal and collective levels, how they relate and how they ought to be emotionally experienced. Careful almost to a fault, Blustein avoids any reductive account of the phenomena he studies, refusing to classify forgiveness, for example, as purely psychological or relational, as political or sentimental, felt or performed. He similarly ventures beyond the analytic philosopher's toolkit, as he draws on the work of psychologists, sociologists and Nietzsche, along with a rare sensitivity to the way things actually occur in the world. The result is much to the reader's benefit and enjoyment, even if it means a longer and more densely packed book.

Still, at the core of his work is, among other things, a new attempt to resolve the tension between forgiving and to maintain the emotional memory of wrongdoing. Indeed, Blustein joins others in the field in, first, rejecting the colloquial conjunction of "forgive and forget." Remembering the wrong is essential to forgiving, he reminds; otherwise, there is little to distinguish one who forgives from one who has been manipulated into discarding or suppressing what was done, or who failed to notice or appreciate it. Beyond that conceptual constraint, moreover, Blustein makes a moral argument pioneered by Hieronymi, to the effect that forgiveness should preserve the victim's self-respect and her commitment to the values that construe what was done to her as wrong in the first place. Forgiveness, in other words, should be accompanied by a complete memory of the wrongdoing and an appreciation of its wrongness, and of oneself as a person worthy of better treatment.

That means that memory, where forgiveness is concerned, cannot be mere memory. To appreciate the wrongfulness of what one suffered, one must disvalue it, and that -- Blustein compellingly argues -- requires negative emotional experience. You cannot relive a betrayal, appreciate its wrongfulness, and not feel badly about it. To remember a wrongdoing and see it for what it was, morally speaking, is to experience that memory negatively. Ideally, that experience should involve some form of protest -- a felt rejection of the behavior and the implication that one may be treated that way. Yet, Blustein is the first to insist that these feelings of protest need not be of the sort favored by philosophers of forgiveness -- resentment, bitterness, and "moral anger," for example. They can also include humiliation, sadness, and disappointment, feelings that involve no hostility or desires aimed at the perpetrator.

Of course, all this is compatible with the victim suddenly changing her emotional disposition once she forgives. Even after remembering the wrong and protesting its wrongfulness, it might be thought she can then sincerely forgive her offender and move on happily thereafter. Or, to follow a more commonly advocated line, she can commit to stop recalling and feeling badly about the wrong done to her. Blustein, however, convincingly -- and refreshingly -- avoids this conclusion. To forgive, he argues, victims need not wipe the slate clean, or even try to do so. They need not forget; indeed, they should not. Instead, he argues, the self-respecting victim will likely continue to remember what happened and, for all the reasons just discussed, experience that recollection negatively. Prudence also demands as much, he points out, as a complete change of heart and mind could make one vulnerable to repeat offenses. Instead, he suggests, we relive and recall the sting of our mistreatment both before and after we forgive it.

What, then, is the special role of forgiveness? Blustein innovatively answers that forgiveness consists not in whether we negatively emotionally experience the memory of being wronged, but in how we do. In particular, it involves regulating and moderating those negative emotional memories, even if they remain negative -- sad, disappointing, or insulting, say -- so that they no longer upset the victims, disrupt their lives or emotional equilibrium, or involve any retributive desires towards their offenders (if they ever did, which to Blustein isn't necessary). Forgiveness, we might say, releases the victim from the grip of these negative emotional experiences; they no longer unsettle her or turn her against her offender, even as she continues to have them when she remembers what he did to her. Instead, they are in her grip now, having been transformed into a stable, sensible, and increasingly less triggered element of her emotional life. They are not dwelled upon, and are instead put in their places.

To that end, Blustein offers insightful and empirically grounded guidance on how to change one's emotional memories, including an ironic suggestion that we learn to forget (he proposes "forget and forgive" to supplement the familiar adage). But by "forget" he does not mean literally forgetting a past wrongdoing, but rather a technique for reducing the intrusiveness of the experienced memories of it, by making them less accessible to one's immediate conscious awareness, and less intense and disruptive when they do come up.

In the second half of the book, Blustein turns to the collective, in a discussion of transitional justice that could well have yielded a new volume altogether. We move from interpersonal slights and violations to the wholesale oppression of a minority by a majority, or a weaker country by an imperial foe. Despite the obvious parallels, however, Blustein resists the temptation to transpose his interpersonal model onto the larger canvass. The collective, political realm presents distinct concerns of its own, including the fact that the victimized group, to maintain its self-respect, may require more public, confrontational behaviors towards their oppressors, and more symbolic, ritualistic and inclusive methods of commemoration. Indeed, commemoration has independent value for victimized groups in light of the need to remind future generations, link wrongdoers and victims, and maintain vigilance to prevent or at least be prepared for future relapses.

Nevertheless, Blustein's fundamental thesis about forgiveness in general has striking application here, as well. For purposes of restorative justice, as with interpersonal reconciliation, the how of emotional memory is what matters most. Collective commemoration of past injustice could, worryingly, be performed in a way that upsets and opens old wounds and sabotages reconciliation. On the other hand, it could facilitate healing -- a means whereby oppressors take and display responsibility, victims protest their mistreatment, and both groups rework their common past into a constructive shared narrative, brimming with hope for a better future. The contrast is as stark as between a riot and a Remembrance Day. Yet Blustein perceptively notes that even grand memorializations, like a monument erected near a cemetery, can be counterproductive, marking the end of active commemoration: we build it, announce it, cut the ribbon, and leave it at that. As in the interpersonal case, communities should, instead, continue to engage with the past violation, and experience it with the proper negative valence that its wrongfulness demands, even while they to do so in a way that is unintrusive, calm, and free of retributive inclinations.

At both levels, Blustein's account is penetrating, nuanced and compelling -- offering, among other things, an original and satisfying answer to the puzzle of how emotions and memory can persist with forgiveness, as well as how forgiveness can facilitate or, alternatively, impede restorative justice. That is not to say I am in complete agreement. I have at least two minor quibbles worth mentioning.

One is interpretive. Blustein early on describes certain psychological or intentional states, notably resentment and anger, as "retributive," by which he means they involve a desire to get back at the wrongdoer. And he further depicts the "standard" philosophical view as holding that forgiveness essentially consists in overcoming these vindictive attitudes. Yet resentment and anger, to my ear at least, need not involve any thoughts or desires about what should happen to the offender. And on my reading, the standard accounts do not turn on the view that they do. An equally plausible view of resentment, for example, could hold that it is the negative experience of (a) the belief that someone wronged me; (b) my resistance to the implication that I may be treated that way, and, much less importantly, (c) my desire to make my offender appreciate both. Nothing in the standard accounts, as I read them, clash with this interpretation or turn pivotally on rejecting it.

Interpretation aside, the kind of negative experience I'm calling "resentment" -- if it is possible -- poses a challenge to any account that emphasizes intrusive, unsettling emotions. Resentment as I've described it would seem to undermine forgiveness even if it was experienced with low intensity and frequency. If I grant you forgiveness for stealing my favorite book, but continue to unpleasantly -- if manageably -- relive your having done so, each time reaffirming the judgment that you're a selfish neighbor and that I deserved better, I might have to question the depth or sincerity of my forgiveness. If nothing else, your discovery that I resent you this way could justifiably elicit your protest: "Hey, I thought you forgave me!"

Conversely, if I forgive you and for that reason decide to try to banish or resist all negative experiences of the wrongdoing remembered, and I stick to this commitment, then I arguably have forgiven you -- fully -- even if I'm plagued by involuntary flashbacks, accompanied by urges to lash out at you for hurting me. As long as I resist and oppose these episodes as they occur, and for the right reasons, it seems I have forgiven my offender no matter their frequency or intensity. If so, then forgiveness may have more to do with how I decide to behave, both externally and cognitively, and with the extent of my commitment to doing so, than with my success at moderating the affective states that happen to overtake me in the process. That, at least, is a possibility I would consider as a serious alternative to Blustein's proposal, one that suggests that a change in the quality of emotional remembrance is neither sufficient nor necessary for forgiveness.

These disagreements, of course, merely reflect the many challenges of training philosophical analysis on forgiveness and emotional remembrance. The terms themselves evoke a range of pre-theoretical understandings, they draw on dizzyingly many actual experiences, both personal and political, and they provoke conflicting ethical intuitions. To say something insightful and philosophically substantive about the phenomena in general is an extraordinary feat. Yet it is one that Blustein has accomplished, with striking power and originality.

And it's not all he's done: in this review I have focused mainly on the connection between memory and forgiveness in Blustein's account, and on how he invaluably responds to a nagging puzzle on that front. But he has equally momentous things to say about the value of remembrance apart from forgiveness, be it the under-appreciated expressive power of symbolic memorialization, or the restorative role that the international community can play in getting states to respond to massive human rights abuses. These and related topics I leave to the myriad discussion that Blustein's book is bound to ignite, if it draws even a fraction of the serious and close attention it richly deserves.