Forgiveness and Retribution: Responding to Wrongdoing

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Margaret R. Holmgren, Forgiveness and Retribution: Responding to Wrongdoing, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 310pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN-13: 9781107017962.

Reviewed by Linda Radzik, Texas A&M University


Margaret Holmgren's Forgiveness and Retribution approaches the moral issues that arise in the aftermath of wrongdoing from the perspective of virtue theory. What sorts of attitudes would be morally best for us to cultivate? The first half of the book addresses this question from the perspective of individual victims and wrongdoers. The second half examines society's response to crime. Holmgren defends a much more robust account of forgiveness than one normally finds in the literature, concluding that, "an attitude of unconditional genuine forgiveness is always appropriate and desirable from a moral point of view, regardless of whether the offender repents and regardless of what he has done or suffered" (p. 10). Similarly, she argues that self-forgiveness need not depend on the wrongdoer's ability to make amends or his being forgiven by others. The most provocative part of the book, however, is Holmgren's critique of other leading theories of forgiveness, specifically those that build upon P. F. Strawson's claim that the reactive attitude of resentment plays a crucial role in moral life (cf. Strawson 1962). Holmgren argues that both the attitude of resentment and the related inclination to judge one another's negative deserts are objectionable. This leads her to argue that our approach to criminal justice must be dramatically reconceived.

Like many contemporary theorists, Holmgren views forgiveness as "a corrective attitude that replaces an initial attitude of resentment that we no longer find worthy" (p. 32). The main question in the literature is what justifies such a correction. According to conditional theorists, a victim needs some special reason to forgive. Typically, it is argued that the wrongdoer must meet some kind of condition (such as repentance) before the victim can properly replace her resentment with something more positive. Those conditions will not always be met, and so forgiveness will not always be justifiable. Unconditional theories of forgiveness, on the other hand, argue that forgiveness is always morally appropriate. Some versions of this theory argue that there are always further considerations (such as the well-being of the victim) that tip the balance of reasons in favor of forgiveness. But Holmgren's version of unconditional theory takes a more radical line. She argues that an attitude of resentment is always fundamentally mistaken.

Holmgren's opponents in this debate include both conditional and unconditional theorists who she labels "attitudinal retributivists," but who might just as well be called "Strawsonians" (e.g. Murphy and Hampton 1988, Hieronymi 2001, Dillon 2001, Griswold 2007). These theorists defend resentment -- a reactive attitude characterized by the judgment that one has been wronged, a feeling of moral anger toward the one responsible, and either a desire to punish or (at least) a withdrawal of goodwill. In resenting, they argue, a victim shows proper respect for himself, for morality and for the offender. Indeed, a lack of resentment leads us to worry that the victim might be condoning his own victimization or viewing the offender as if she were a child or an animal, that is, something less than a competent moral agent.

Holmgren's critique of attitudinal retributivism is two-fold. First, she argues that a victim can appropriately respect herself, morality and the offender without resenting. For example, a person who responds to being wronged by compassionately encouraging the offender to make amends can satisfy all three of these forms of respect. Secondly, Holmgren argues that an attitude of resentment is itself a failure of respect because it objectifies the wrongdoer.

Specifically, retributivists conflate the offender in various ways with his actions and attitudes, and as a result adopt a perspective of judgment toward the conglomerate of the offender and his wrongful actions and attitudes. They thereby fail to respect the offender as both a sentient being and as a moral agent who retains his basic moral capacities in spite of his wrongdoing (p. 11).

Holmgren calls her alternative to attitudinal retributivism the "paradigm of forgiveness." This is "a particular moral orientation toward persons," according to which,

certain features of persons are regarded as salient -- our capacity to experience happiness and misery; our basic desire for happiness; our capacity for moral choice, growth and awareness; our status as autonomous beings who can lead meaningful lives only as the authors of our own choices and attitudes; and our status as limited beings who are vulnerable to error (p. 4).

In forgiving, we come to see that the wrongdoer is distinct from his wrongful actions. We see that, while his misdeeds should be opposed, he should be regarded with respect, compassion, and goodwill. We aim to encourage his flourishing rather than to do him harm, unless doing him harm is necessary in order to prevent greater or equal harm to others.

The claim that resentment is fundamentally morally mistaken might sound like a rather harsh response to resentful victims. To condemn resentment as morally wrong threatens to blame people for the natural consequence of their own victimization. But, importantly, Holmgren has no interest in condemning people who resent (indeed, she is not interested in condemning anyone). Instead, she sees resentment as something that victims must acknowledge, work through, and leave behind through what she labels "the process of forgiveness."

Holmgren extends the paradigm of forgiveness to cases where one is oneself the wrongdoer. Self-forgiveness is always morally appropriate because self-condemning attitudes are always mistaken. They fail to distinguish the value of one's self from the value of one's actions and attitudes. Of course, some of the ways in which offenders overcome self-condemning attitudes are morally problematic, as, for example, when they deny that their actions were really wrong or that they were responsible for them. Holmgren argues that, in order to be virtuous, self-forgiveness must result from a process through which we acknowledge our faults and make amends. But this process of virtuous self-forgiveness should not be read as a set of conditions for permissible self-forgiveness. Respect, compassion and goodwill toward ourselves are always appropriate, but these attitudes will not be part of a well-integrated and virtuous frame of mind until we also have the proper attitudes towards our misdeeds.

Turning from the private to the public realm, Holmgren continues her debate with the attitudinal retributivists. Her opponents, she argues, are committed to the idea that desert is a fundamental moral concern. As victims we resent our abusers and as a society we punish criminals (at least in part) because we believe they deserve such negative responses. However, argues Holmgren, when we recognize that it is a mistake to conflate people with their actions and attitudes and adopt the paradigm of forgiveness, we will see that people should always and unconditionally be met with respect, compassion, and goodwill.

How, then, are we to deal with the genuine social problems that crime creates? The first step, Holmgren argues, is to replace a desert-based moral theory with what she calls a "justice-based" moral theory. She writes, "an attitude of justice incorporates an attitude of respect, compassion and real goodwill extended to all persons equally," which motivates us "to secure for each individual the most fundamental benefits at stake in the situation at issue, compatible with like benefits for all" (p. 170). With this principle of justice in mind, we can require criminal wrongdoers to make restitution for their crimes at the same time we maintain a forgiving attitude toward them.

Much of the second half of the book is spent developing this justice-based approach to criminal punishment. Holmgren argues that her view can provide a theoretical foundation for many of the practices advocated by the restorative justice movement, such as face-to-face meetings between victims and offenders and restitution rather than incarceration. Holmgren accepts that incarceration is sometimes appropriate, but she argues that this too can be understood as a kind of restitution. In incarcerating a criminal, we are requiring her to bear the cost of the increased security burden on the community that her crime helped create.

Whether Holmgren can adequately develop her restitutive theory of criminal justice without subtly importing a concept of desert is a question worth asking, though one I am unable to pursue here. The idea of desert is so deeply ingrained in our moral thinking that it is hard to imagine doing without it completely. It also puts the argumentative burden on the theorist who claims that we must give it up. Holmgren develops a number of objections to the concept of desert, including worries about how we can make sense of principles of proportionality and how we can justify matching negative moral judgments to particular forms of hard treatment. But I would like to concentrate on the line of critique that Holmgren deploys against both desert and resentment.

Holmgren argues that judgments of negative desert and attitudes of resentment make the fundamental mistake of confusing actors with their actions or attitudes. She presents a series of arguments that aim to establish that people are not constituted by their actions or attitudes. But I fail to see why she believes this line of argument is so important. Her opponents do not need to claim that people are constituted by their actions or attitudes; they merely need to argue that people can legitimately be held responsible for their actions and attitudes. What matters are that the actions and attitudes are mine, not that they are me.

I think Holmgren has misidentified the main issue separating herself and her opponents, and that this is the major flaw of the book. However, Holmgren's discussion raises a number of other issues that take us deeper into the heart of things. These points deserve a closer look since attitudinal retributivism is indeed prominent in literatures on forgiveness and criminal punishment, as well as on moral responsibility more generally.

We can interpret the disagreement between Holmgren and the attitudinal retributivists as a debate over the permissible ways of holding people responsible for wrongdoing.[1] The attitudinal retributivists see resentment as a central means of holding people responsible. But Holmgren rejects resentment as a failure of what Stephen Darwall has called "recognition respect" (Darwall 1977). In resenting, we fail to recognize the intrinsic value all people have, given their status as moral agents. However, the attitudinal retributivists deny that resentment is a failure of recognition respect (see, for example, Darwall 2006). Indeed, they insist that the attitude of resentment presupposes that its target is a moral agent. To resent a wrongdoer is instead to regard him with "appraisal disrespect" (which is Darwall's term for a kind of negative evaluative attitude that can legitimately vary with a person's behavior).

If I understand Holmgren correctly, she believes that viewing a person with appraisal disrespect is a kind of category mistake. Appraisal disrespect can only be held towards actions or attitudes. The attitudinal retributivists disagree. They believe one can simultaneously regard an offender with both recognition respect and appraisal disrespect.

This debate might also be read as one about the phenomenology of recognition respect. Holmgren writes, "Recognition of the inherent value of anything will necessarilybe accompanied by a positive response, rather than a hostile or negative response, to that thing. It will also be accompanied by a desire to see that which is of value preserved, protected, and enhanced" (p. 90). On her view, there is no room for negative feelings about the wrongdoer once one truly recognizes his status.

Another way to understand Holmgren's objection to using resentment to hold people responsible is in terms of coercion. Resentment is an attitude that insists that a legitimate demand has been violated. Our moral anger and the withdrawal of our goodwill are means of both communicating this demand and enforcing it. As Holmgren puts it, the resentful victim "orients herself toward using resentment and rejection to manipulate the offender into acknowledging her worth, or toward dominating him in some way" (p. 69). To Holmgren, this sort of response is both lacking in self-respect (the victim should not need the offender to confirm her value for her) and objectionably coercive. While Holmgren allows that coercion is sometimes justified as a response to wrongdoing, this is true only when coercion is needed to prevent harm to other people. A coercive response is not justified merely by the fact of wrongdoing.

In the literature on "holding responsible," attitudinal retributivists tend to emphasize the communicative work done by resentment and underplay the ways in which it exerts a coercive pressure on its object (cf. McKenna, 2012). Holmgren is right to raise this objection, but it needs to be explored further. One way to do this would be to compare differing views of goodwill. For example, Scanlon seems to believe that withdrawals of goodwill are not objectionably coercive because we do not owe one another goodwill in the first place (Scanlon 2008). In contrast, Holmgren believes that goodwill is unconditionally appropriate, that it must be extended to all people regardless of their behavior. Unfortunately, neither one develops their view of goodwill in enough depth for us to adjudicate the issue.

So, Holmgren's critique of the attitudinal retributivist's mode of holding people responsible is intriguing, though not definitive. But what about her own view? How may we hold one another responsible, according to the paradigm of forgiveness? One of Holmgren's goals is to show that there are a number of ways in which we can hold wrongdoers accountable -- communicating with them, securing restitution for victims -- without becoming resentful. But she also insists that the mere fact that other people are responsible does not entitle us to do anything about it. "Although we may legitimately control the behavior of moral agents under certain circumstances to prevent harm to others, a respect for their autonomy requires us to view them as responsible for their own inner moral development" (p. 227).

As a critique of attitudinal retributivism, Forgiveness and Retribution leaves one wanting more. In focusing so heavily on the alleged actor/action conflation, I think Holmgren fails to develop her more promising critiques of resentment. However, as an alternative to attitudinal retributivism, the book is more successful. Holmgren defends the paradigm of forgiveness without ever underestimating the significance of wrongdoing or the toll it takes on victims, offenders and their communities. In this way, she offers us an account of forgiveness that embodies the respect and compassion it advocates.

Works Cited

Darwall, S. (2006). The Second-Person Standpoint: Morality, Respect and Accountability. Cambridge, MA, Harvard.

Darwall, S. L. (1977). "Two Kinds of Respect." Ethics 88(1): 36-49.

Dillon, R. S. (2001). "Self-Forgiveness and Self-Respect." Ethics 112(1): 53-83.

Griswold, C. L. (2007). Forgiveness: A Philosophical Exploration. New York, Cambridge.

Hieronymi, P. (2001). "Articulating an Uncompromising Forgiveness." Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 62(3): 529-554.

Macnamara, C. (2011). "Holding Others Responsible." Philosophical Studies 152(1): 81-102.

McKenna, M. (2012). Conversation and Responsibility. New York, Oxford.

Murphy, J. G. and J. Hampton (1988). Forgiveness and Mercy. New York, Cambridge.

Scanlon, T. M. (2008). Moral Dimensions: Permissibility, Meaning, Blame. Cambridge, Mass., Belknap/Harvard.

Smith, A. M. (2007). "On Being Responsible and Holding Responsible." Journal of Ethics 11(4): 465-484.

Strawson, P. F. (1962). "Freedom and Resentment." Proceedings of the British Academy 48: 187-211.

Wallace, R. J. (1994). Responsibility and the Moral Sentiments. Cambridge, Mass., Harvard University Press.

Watson, G. (1996). "Two Faces of Responsibility." Philosophical Topics 24(2): 227-248.

[1] There is a growing literature on the concept of "holding responsible" that Holmgren does not directly address. See, for example, Watson 1996, Smith 2007, and Macnamara 2011. Within this literature, attitudinal retributivism is defended by Wallace 1994, Darwall 2006, McKenna 2012, and, if we stretch the definition a bit, Scanlon 2008. Although Scanlon does not give a central role to resentment, he defends holding people responsible through the withdrawal of goodwill.