Forgiveness and Revenge

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Govier, Trudy, Forgiveness and Revenge, Routledge, 2002, 205pp, $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415278554.

Reviewed by Mary Sigler, Arizona State University


Trudy Govier’s thoughtful examination of forgiveness and revenge considers the moral and practical implications of choosing forgiveness rather than revenge in the context of both personal and political wrongdoing. Focusing on South Africa’s Truth and Reconciliation Commission in particular, and intranational ethnic and political conflict more generally, Govier makes a case for forgiveness among groups in the political realm that is meant to draw strength from—and strengthen—the case for forgiveness among individuals. Relying on a mix of scholarly literature, intellectual journalism, and vivid historical and contemporary examples, Govier rejects what she takes to be the conventional view that some moral wrongs are so egregious that their perpetrators are absolutely unforgivable. According to Govier, there are no “moral monsters”: “It is both dangerous and unethical to write off a human individual or group as permanently and incorrigibly evil.” (140) Likewise, Govier rejects even the qualified defense of revenge offered in recent scholarly and popular works. “The fundamental objection to revenge is that it is founded on the cultivation in ourselves of a desire [to delight in the suffering of another] which is morally evil.” (13) Regardless of whether one accepts her conclusions, Govier presents a compelling—if overly sanguine—vision of a more humane and constructive approach to forgiveness and revenge.

Apart from her strong conclusion that no one is, in principle, unforgivable, the most distinctive aspect of Govier’s work is the application of forgiveness to the political domain. This requires Govier first to establish that a group as such can forgive—can form beliefs, experience harm, and act. Toward this end, she argues that a group may act or be affected both distributively and collectively. Thus, harm to an individual based on his membership in a group may be experienced as a harm by other group members distributively, in feelings of insecurity or vulnerability, for example. Additionally, a group may experience harm collectively if group resources, such as land or other possessions, are taken or destroyed. Further, Govier challenges the claim that only individuals—indeed, direct victims—possess the requisite moral standing to forgive wrongdoers. She argues plausibly that because a wrongdoer’s misdeeds will often affect secondary and tertiary “victims,” such victims are likewise positioned to extend (or withhold) forgiveness. Govier offers the example of slain anti-apartheid activist Steve Biko, whose murder represented a grievous loss to his family (secondary victims) and to his community (tertiary victims). (93) “Even if we grant the assumption that victims have a special prerogative to forgive, there remains moral space for groups to forgive, because—distributively and collectively—groups can be victims.” (94)

In addition to post-apartheid South Africa, Govier examines the dynamic of forgiveness and revenge in the Balkans, in the context of various African civil wars, and during and after the Holocaust. In a chapter entitled “The Unforgivable,” Govier analyzes the responses of various public figures to Simon Weisenthal’s wartime dilemma, related in “The Sunflower,” whether to forgive a dying SS officer for appalling atrocities against Jews. Distinguishing forgiving from forgetting, excusing, and condoning, Govier demonstrates that some of the respondents’ arguments against forgiveness reflect conditional, rather than absolute, unforgivability. That is, doubts about the officer’s sincerity and about Weisenthal’s standing to forgive atrocities against other Jews constitute obstacles to forgiveness that, in principle, could be removed.

Govier’s own rejection of absolute unforgivability is premised on a “broadly Kantian” (64) respect for persons as responsible moral agents: “To regard human agents as capable of redemption is the morally appropriate attitude to adopt towards them, an attitude that is a kind of secular faith.” (137) (In two brief appendices, Govier discusses various religious perspectives on forgiveness and offers a secular, essentially Kantian, justification for an ethic grounded in respect for persons.) Govier does not deny that some acts are unforgivable, though she rejects this formulation as misleading; it is actors, not their deeds, who will (or will not) be forgiven. Accordingly, “[t]o claim that because he has committed terrible deeds a moral agent is reducible to those deeds and is thus absolutely unforgivable is to ignore the human capacity for remorse, choice, and moral transformation.” (112) Relatedly, Govier emphasizes the fact of universal human fallibility as a basis for forgiveness, observing that cases of even brutal wrongdoing—by violent inner city gang members or low-level participants in ethnic cleansing, for example—should be understood in their particular context. “These cases illustrate the phenomenon of moral luck and offer a humbling reminder that those of us who lead fundamentally decent and comfortable lives might have done otherwise, had our luck been different.” (129)

Govier’s often persuasive analysis is not without notable shortcomings. As an initial matter, she builds a case for forgiveness on an incomplete account of the alternatives. Thus, the victim who withholds forgiveness is depicted as “clinging to a resentful sense of her own victimhood and dwelling on the past” (63), paralyzed by self-destructive emotions. Although forgiveness presumably entails overcoming resentment, anger, and bitterness, Govier has not established—or even addressed whether—forgiving is the only way to overcome these emotions. Common experience suggests otherwise. An individual may overcome resentment, yet decline to forgive. One may sever ties with a disloyal friend or an unfaithful lover, for example, without forgiving or harboring feelings of resentment and anger. Sometimes we just move on. Govier acknowledges that “[r]evenge and forgiveness do not … exhaust the possibilities in terms of attitudinal responses to wrongdoing” (vii), but her analysis consistently ignores this complexity. Groups and individuals are portrayed as either healthy, constructive forgivers or bitter, debilitated resenters. The moral universe is more complex—and often less dramatic—than Govier’s discussion suggests.

The sharp dichotomy between forgiving and resenting, which seems out of place in various personal relationships, may nevertheless have a special applicability in the context of political forgiveness. Govier’s primary focus, after all, is the prospect for forgiveness between antagonistic ethnic and political groups within a single nation or region. In these contexts—South Africa, Rwanda, the Balkans—disengaging is unlikely to be a viable option because “abused peoples and their enemies or former enemies have little choice but to live together in geographical proximity.” (107) In these circumstances, victims and perpetrators face issues of “transitional justice”—”rebuilding together a society in which they will live and work together on a daily basis.” (106-07) In the absence of forgiveness, Govier worries that mere “[n]on-violent co-existence is unlikely to be sustainable if past wrongs are unexamined and feelings of hatred and alienation persist.” (143) While this political reality strengthens the case for group forgiveness, it exposes the limitations of the analogy between personal and political forgiveness on which much of Govier’s analysis relies.

Govier’s particular focus on political forgiveness may also explain her otherwise curious observations about the nature of victimhood: “It seems likely that most situations of wrongdoing feature wrongs by both or all involved parties,” rendering the “absolutist tones of the victim/offender and victim/perpetrator terminology … regrettable.” (176) Indeed, Govier showcases many political conflicts in which mutual wrongdoing blurs the distinction between victim and perpetrator groups. However, while the “no innocent victims” mentality may be appropriate in certain political contexts, and even some personal relationships, it has no constructive application to most instances of serious criminal wrongdoing. For example, it would be morally repugnant to urge a rape victim to contemplate forgiveness of her attacker based on a recognition of her own culpability. In the criminal justice context, where Govier suggests issues of forgiveness and resentment may have important policy implications, her casual rejection of the victim/offender terminology seems utterly misplaced.

Govier, in fact, traces some of the criminal justice policy implications of her conception of forgiveness. “For a state or society to support policies implying that some human beings are beyond redemption and deserve to be put away or thrown away, for good, is for that state and society to demonstrate a lack of respect for those persons, as persons.” (137) Accordingly, Govier rejects capital punishment and life sentences without the possibility of parole because they treat offenders as “so much moral garbage.” (138) Kant, however, famously argued that respect for persons may require such harsh penalties in order that individuals receive their just deserts. That is, if the human “capacity for autonomous rational choice [is] our most morally significant feature” (165), as Govier (following Kant) maintains, then respecting that capacity may require the imposition of harsh—even irrevocable—punishment commensurate with an offender’s wrongdoing. Far from establishing that capital punishment is immoral, the Kantian “respect for persons” that Govier invokes would seem to endorse it. Although Govier is entitled to reject Kant’s strict retributivism, her failure to address it altogether blunts the force of her own “Kantian” policy prescriptions.

Finally, despite Govier’s sensitivity to the perils of moral equivalence (50; 156), she assimilates a wide range of conduct under the general heading of wrongdoing. Lamenting the tendency of groups to dwell on their own sense of victimization, for example, Govier notes that “Jews are victims of the Holocaust but oppressors of the Arab population within Israel.” (155) Likewise, a “black American soldier may be the descendant of enslaved and brutalized peoples, yet also a willing participant in the deaths, due to the destruction of infrastructure in the Gulf War of 1991, of hundreds of thousands of Iraqi children.” (156) While Govier hopes that “[a]cknowledging respects in which we are perpetrators may allow us empathy and a flexible understanding of those who, individually or collectively, may have wronged us,” (157), these examples are too controversial to make the point. Although reasonable people can disagree about Israel’s policy toward its Arab population or the United States’s decision to liberate Kuwait, to link this conduct with the attempt to annihilate European Jewry or the brutal exploitation of African American slaves seems morally obtuse.

Perhaps the failure to appreciate such distinctions results from Govier’s belief that neither groups nor individuals are truly evil. Thus, “[t]o brand an entire nation or group—whether Iraqis, Serbs, Germans or Muslims—as incorrigibly evil is to make a deep mistake boding ill for future relationships.” (139) But aren’t there some groups—Nazis (not Germans), Al Qaeda (not Muslims)—we rightly deem evil precisely because they are incapable of constructive relationships? A group whose raison d’etre is the perpetration of evil cannot be redeemed; it can only be resisted.

On balance, Govier’s book represents a significant contribution to our understanding of the dynamics of forgiveness and revenge, especially in the political context. However, having structured her analysis in terms of a particular challenge—to identify and defend the elements of a personal ethics of forgiveness that can be constructively applied to the political realm—Govier makes a case for political forgiveness that depends less on the moral virtues of forgiveness than on the undesirable practical consequences of the alternatives. Indeed, despite Govier’s appealing vision of forgiveness among individuals, she has not established that the Kantian respect for persons entails a rejection of absolute unforgivability. Moreover, by neglecting to consider alternatives that lie between forgiveness and resentment, Govier overstates even the practical urgency of individual forgiveness. In these limited respects, Govier’s otherwise fine effort falls short of the mark.